The Quest of the Absolute: Birth and Decline of European Romanticism

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Louis Dupré, The Quest of the Absolute: Birth and Decline of European Romanticism, University of Notre Dame Press, 2013, 387pp., $36.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268026165.

Reviewed by Casey Haskins, Purchase College, State University of New York


Arthur O. Lovejoy argued nearly a century ago that the word "Romanticism" has been used in so many ways that we do best to drop its singular generic usage and speak instead of a plurality of Romanticisms. If Lovejoy lived today, one imagines him also noting the plurality of what we might call "metaromanticisms," that is, of different views about the cultural functions and meanings of things Romantic and of uses of the word in the service of various humanistic and post-humanistic projects. One particularly charged parting of the metaromantic ways in recent years has been over the issue of whether, to recall a famous comment of Friedrich Schlegel's, human thought might ever attain the unity of a system or whether it is fated always to be a set of fragments. Whereas the latter possibility makes certain friends of unity and foundationality in metaphysics, epistemology and theology nervous, it provides key mythic support for various pluralistic, relativistic, nonfoundational and skeptical turns in postmodern-era thought.

Louis Dupré, a philosopher and Catholic theologian, is not, it is safe to say, a fan of postmodern fragmentation. Most of this final volume in his trilogy on the development of modern culture consists of a historical overview of major philosophical and literary developments in the German, French and British Romantic traditions. But framing this is a larger argument about the cultural needs these developments originally served and about whether Romanticism can still speak to certain crises of meaning and value that we all face today. In Dupré's willfully melancholy view, it almost certainly cannot. He begins (after dismissing Lovejoy's pluralistic argument in a footnote) from a premise fit to serve as a Rorschach test for all metaromantically attuned readers now. Nineteenth century Romanticism, he suggests, was a single, historically well-demarcated movement of thought, a "positive worldview," that in the end was united around a single aim: to overcome the systematic failures of Enlightenment thought and grasp "the Absolute" -- a postulated, never fully representable, unconditioned ground of the multitude of humanity's fragmentary efforts to know itself and its place in the world. The first of the book's three parts summarizes major developments in British, German, and French literature between the late eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries. Part two provides an overview of main period theories in aesthetics, psychology and ethics. The third part offers broader reflections on romantic ideas of history, philosophical method, and religion.

Dupré's sympathetic sketches of figures and themes reflect a deep knowledge of classical and early modern literature and a practitioner's grasp of Christian theology. The result sometimes reads like a large novel with many complicated characters (Schlegel in fact once suggested that we can interpret the whole of Romantic literature as a single sprawling text), at others, like a treatise on intellectual history. Dupré is particularly attentive to his subjects' efforts to negotiate ambivalent attractions to both transcendently theological and more worldly interpretations of their experience. Given the messy cauldron of desires for and refusals of metaphysical closure that at some level is likely to inform anyone's reflection on such subjects, the critic's game of declaring the true intentions of a given Romantic writer has more than a little in common with psychoanalysis. Dupré knows the game well, and his analyses of many of his subjects give a subtle advantage to explanations that keep something like monotheistic longings consciously or unconsciously in play within their reflections. Against M.H. Abrams' claim that the Wordsworth of the Prelude came to regard "nature" as signifying something substantially different from "God," he writes that the poem's final references to love refer to

a power that, though dwelling in mind and nature, transcends both. . . . Wordsworth's faith is not a traditional Christian one . . . Nonetheless, for him, as for Schleiermacher, full humanity includes God-consciousness, at least in the sense that the imagination signals a supernatural presence, which no other mental is able to identify.

And Schleiermacher himself (whom other commentators have portrayed as the Romantic crusader against religious uniformity par excellence) receives an interpretation that again gives a slight edge to unity. His systematic theology "follows the principle of subjectivity to its extreme conclusions [and] appears to be caught between a vague pantheism, on the one side, and a radically negative theology, on the other." Friedrich Hölderlin is a poignant case of a writer whose acute sense of modern psychic division and homelessness remained tempered by a longing delicately poised between existential hope and despair:

In expressing the sadness caused by the absence of God, . . . [Hölderlin] formulated a negative theology for late modernity [and] viewed his poetry as an act of keeping the memory of the sacred mystery alive after the sacred signs of the past had vanished and new ones had not yet appeared.

Dupré recognizes too that some figures particularly resist easy theological categorization, as with Goethe's Wilhelm Meister, who "must choose his life in a world that sets physical and social limits to his choice. The outcome will be his own creation, whether he succeeds or fails. The individual no longer feels determined by a preexisting order." We also learn about less canonical figures such as Gérard de Nerval, author of the psychological novels Sylvie and Aurelia. Nerval (known for walking in the Palais Royal gardens with a pet lobster on a blue ribbon) had a series of breakdowns that fueled autobiographical writings. These in turn anticipated later psychoanalytic ideas about psychic conflict and gave distinctive voice to a modern search for unity in a world where science has eclipsed the powers of religion.

A chapter on the beautiful and the sublime surveys main aesthetic theories from Kant through Schiller, Hegel and Schopenhauer. John Ruskin, the watercolorist and critic, was also gripped by the above-mentioned ambivalence, to good creative effect: "Ruskin searched for an absolute in aesthetic perfection. Yet he never found it, nor did he know what he ought to look for. Did it consist in the spiritual element alone or combined with a 'healthy naturalism'?" Dupré is particularly fond, within Romanticism's paranovelistic cast of characters, of Stendhal, for reasons connected equally to the form and content of novels like The Charterhouse of Parma and The Red and the Black. Fabrice, the protagonist of Charterhouse, "gazes down on the world from the Farnese tower, in which he is imprisoned, with the same indifference with which Julien Sorel in Le Rouge et le Noir, while waiting for his execution, reflects on his past life." Dupré hints that Fabrice's gaze is allegorical also of the early nineteenth century spectatorially detached "ideal of pure beauty," which, we are darkly and tersely told, "perished during the Romantic period, and it probably did so because of Romanticism."

Sometimes, to generously paraphrase Freud, an execution is just an execution. But the first thing one sees before one even opens The Quest of the Absolute and which provides a visual introduction to its argument is an execution scene. The cover's reproduction of Karl Blecher's 1835 painting Gallows in a Thunderstorm features a lone suspended human figure, framed on a hill against a bleak shoreline. The image might easily pass as a depiction of a certain more iconic crucifixion, a fact hard to miss for anyone sensitized (as were many Romantic artists, including, notably, Ruskin) to the ways in which pictures convey and complement the meanings of literary texts (ut pictura poesis). The melancholy implication seems to be that the quest for the Romantic Absolute, and with it virtually everything of value in canonical Romanticism itself, has been effectively crucified, or, returning to the gallows metaphor, hung out to dry, by successive generations of that quest's "cultured despisers." (This phrase comes from Schleiermacher's book on the status of European religion after the Enlightenment.) One surmises from the text and notes that true Romanticism's cultured despisers, for Dupré, include Nietzscheans, naturalists, Emersonians, pragmatic polytheists, left-Schlegelian ironists, and others who have pushed the topic of unifying final transcendence off the agenda for late-and post-modern intellectual discussion. And in doing so they accelerated the discontents of disenchanted modern civilization to an extent that is now all but irreversible:

The sense of alienation, sharply articulated by Nietzsche . . . still remained intrinsically linked to the disappointment of Romantic aspirations. Today a feeling of resignation, following centuries of frustrated attempts to overcome the problems inherent in modern consciousness, has obscured their presence . . . 'Romantic' above all are our revived fears and uncertainties about the future . . . How far should we pursue the possibilities that science and technology have opened up? Do we possess the moral maturity to control the awesome forces we have unleashed? . . . As the Romantics continue to remind us, this existential dread reopens the question of human boundaries and, with it, the question of what transcends them.

This question, given Dupré's evident metaromantic sympathies, seems for him to be: how, in the twenty-first century, can we find new ways of moving beyond ordinary, nature-bound humanity to make contact, as many Romantics longed to do, with something sacred and transcendent? This interpretation of the human-boundary question may appeal at least to those who are convinced that, metaphysically dual perpetual immigrants that we are (a famous theme of Hölderlin's), we are ill-fitted to be fully at home in the natural world, and that we have, in the era of science and technology, sundered nature beyond redemption. But such a tragic assessment of the world is likely to be less than persuasive not only for readers who view the European Romantics through the lens of books like Abrams' Natural Supernaturalism, but also to readers of more optimistic Romantic traditions that fall outside the scope of Dupré's narrative. One thinks particularly of the American tradition that runs in different variants from Emerson through Dewey, Cavell, Rorty, and others, and that has generated works of recent metaromantic commentary like Charles Larmore's The Romantic Legacy and Richard Eldridge's The Persistence of Romanticism.

Are we, such readers might wonder, really as helpless today about finding solutions to the global problems we have created as Dupré believes? They might also, turning again to the nineteenth century, fairly ask to which "problems inherent in modern consciousness" Romantic thought, in Dupré's definition, sought solutions, as if it were a new software program brought in to clean up (unsuccessfully) its culture's crashing operational system. Might these problems include the nineteenth century's Faustian dissatisfaction with the current state of knowledge? Or its Blakean refusal to view the sources of good and evil as completely separate? Or its Schillerian fascination with the human capacity to create and endlessly play with perceptual forms, independently of utility, that attained new levels of self-reflexivity and virtuosity in artistic modernism? Or its growing Schleiermachean embrace of the diversity of legitimate forms of religious experience?

One might, from different premises, argue that Romanticism in fact contributed (and still contributes) in vital and sustainable ways to its spiritual culture even if it was itself also far from spiritually pure in its essence and was at various levels also a bearer of many of modernity's most worrisome problems. Consider that some of its darkest and most dangerous forms of modern alienation have resulted precisely from what happens when people pursue quests for absolutes that get defined in a too exclusivistic way. Witness for example the more virulent forms of nineteenth and twentieth century German nationalism, whose ideological linkage to the thinking of German Romantic figures like Fichte (discussed in a later chapter on political theories after the French Revolution) triggered anti-Romantic reactions in some quarters. Those reactions went too far and were based in overly reductive conceptions of the complexity of Romantic thought; still, it is not only Enlightenment thought that invites an Adorno/Horkheimer style of dialectical analysis.

This is not to say that Dupré's melancholy framing premise is self-evidently false. Nothing about logic or language prevents one from stipulatively defining "Romanticism" as being essentially about attempting to know the Absolute, then observing that all such attempts have failed, and then planning for the funeral (or perhaps viewing postmodernity, as Dupré seems to do, as if it were itself the funeral, followed by a barbarically mindless celebration). But that would be like concluding that religion is dead just because Christianity took a cultural-political beating in the nineteenth century from Enlightenment atheism and Darwinian naturalism. Thoughtful metaromantic arguments now do well to guard against the temptations of compositional reasoning (which infers the character of a complex whole from truths about its parts). They might also be wary of treating complex areas of historically evolving cultural practice (like Romanticism, not to mention religion generally) as if they were natural kinds possessing historically fixed logical essences. An alternative approach which still leaves room for plenty of speculation about the spiritual fate of modernity might consider instead modeling them after something more fluid, organic, and evolving -- like a sprawling novel filled with lots of complicated, optimistic, and melancholy characters (not all of them Europeans), and whose process of composition is still, fortunately, far from finished.