The Realistic Empiricism of Mach, James, and Russell: Neutral Monism Reconceived

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Erik C. Banks, The Realistic Empiricism of Mach, James, and Russell: Neutral Monism Reconceived, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 217pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107073869.

Reviewed by Emmett L. Holman, George Mason University


It is the contention of Erik Banks in his new book that Ernst Mach, William James, and Bertrand Russell can, at least in their most mature phases, best be seen as representatives -- indeed, the creators -- of a single philosophical position, one that might be called 'neutral monism' and that Banks usually calls 'realistic empiricism'. Given this, Banks maintains that these three have often been misread. There are, of course differences among them. But there is a common thread that one (with sufficiently careful reading) can see running through the views of all three. This thread, if picked up and developed, can point the direction toward solving some outstanding philosophical problems. It is this thread that constitutes their neutral monist/realistic empiricist positions.

Banks devotes his Introduction to sketching out what this realistic empiricism amounts to. He then turns, in Chapters 1-4, to an exposition of the three philosophers' views, aiming to convince us that they do, indeed, in their varying ways and with varying degrees of completeness, subscribe to realistic empiricism. Chapter 1 shows how this is so for Mach's views on the nature of the physical world and the form that physical theory should take, and Chapter 2 shows how it is so for Mach's philosophy of mind. Chapter 3 is devoted to James and Chapter 4 to Russell. In Chapter 5 Banks shows how realistic empiricism might be used to solve the mind-body problem, and in Chapter 6 he applies it to the problem of constructing extension and space-time from more fundamental elements.

All this is fascinating and heady stuff, both for the controversial interpretations it offers and the rather exotic metaphysical views it floats. Certainly Banks has done us a service by presenting all this. But there are a number of places where things are not explained very clearly, and others where they are just outright puzzling. I will address a few of these further on. So even though I recommend the book, my recommendation comes with qualifications.

Let me begin with an account of this so-called 'realistic empiricism'. It has a number of salient features that distinguish it from traditional empiricisms and logical positivism. For one thing, the fundamental particulars are not static objects, either of the common sense physical object or the sense datum variety, but 'event particulars', which are manifestations of powers and in turn manifest qualities. (I'm not sure I entirely understand Banks' 'manifestation' talk, by the way; but I won't push that.) The apparently 'static' objects are constructed from these. Furthermore, these event particulars are neither mental nor physical in themselves, but are one or the other depending on the kind of causal-functional relations they enter into. The upshot is a rejection of an irreducible ego, a Brentano-esque intrinsic intentionality, and qualia as intrinsically mental. Furthermore, this theory does not privilege observed events over unobserved events. All are equally real as long as they are causally continuous with observation. So, there is no attempt to start with observed events and logically or linguistically 'construct' the unobserved from these, the latter being understood to exist only 'in a manner of speaking', as it were. This is important, because Russell is often interpreted as a phenomenalist and Mach as a logical positivist before his time. Both of these Banks sees as misreadings (or, in Russell's case, at least a misreading of him from 1919 on). Relatedly, this realistic empiricism "is not a second-order study of the methods, language, or structure of what 'science says'. It does not offer models of explanation, canons of methodology, or a rational reconstruction of theories and methods in use in science" (p. 4). Rather, it is, in a sense, an account of how the world works, but in a curious, indirect way. It is "a working 'umbrella theory' of the sciences, or a theory schema for constructing empirical theories in physics and perceptual psychology" (p. 4).

But here things get unclear. What, exactly, is an umbrella theory? What is supposed to be the relation between an umbrella theory and the specific empirical theories for which they are schema? Or correspondingly, what is supposed to be the relation between the ontology of the former and that of the latter? Given what has been said, it is not like the relation between, say Carnap's (1956) account of the structure of science and specific scientific theories,[1] or the relationship that phenomenalists saw between sense data and physical objects. So is it like the relationship between, say, molecular structure and forces, on the one hand, and the solidity, liquidity or gaseous nature of a piece of matter, on the other? Or is it more like the relationship between the Kantian noumenal world and the phenomenal world we encounter via the categories of the understanding and spatio-temporal intuitions? There are hints of (something like) both in Banks' exposition of these three philosophers. Of course it's possible that they were not all of one mind on this, or that they themselves (or one or more of them) were unclear. Banks doesn't give us much help in sorting this out. In particular, his one concrete example is not very helpful. He cites Darwin's 1859 theory of evolution as an example of an umbrella theory, and the modern synthesis of genetic and evolutionary theory as a theory under which it is subsumed. But certainly we don't see the 1859 theory as more fundamental than the modern synthesis. We see it as incomplete. The mechanisms and ontology of the modern synthesis are not, in any sense derived from a more fundamental ontology of the 1859 theory. Rather, the 1859 theory is lacking an ontology that the modern synthesis fills in. It is true that Banks' terminology -- characterizing an umbrella theory as a 'theory schema', e.g. -- sometimes invites that way of looking at it. But if we run with that idea, we see an umbrella theory as a strict formalization, with no ontology at all. But that is clearly not how Banks sees realistic empiricism.

All of this is perhaps most relevant to Mach's version of realistic empiricism. As Banks sees it, Mach was out to reform Newtonian physics. He was dissatisfied with its mechanistic outlook, and aspired to replace its fundamental concepts of mass, force, space and time with something else. His dissatisfaction with these concepts was that they are creatures of the contingencies of how our minds work, relying on mental imagery and the like. And how can we assume that the non-mental world out there is beholden to such contingencies? This perhaps suggests something approximating a Kantian noumenal-phenomenal relation between the new theory he hoped to develop and Newtonian physics. But that's not clear.

But let's turn to the specifics of what Mach had in mind. What about this new theory? What exactly is going to be its ontology? Is it going to be any less anthropocentric than the Newtonian physics it replaces? According to Mach, the fundamental entities -- what he calls the 'elements' -- are energy changes. How is this any less mechanistic and anthropocentric than what we get from Newton? One would think picture thinking would come into play here: the quantity of energy rising and falling and the like. But no, says Banks; Mach rejected this picture. He did not take the idea of a quantity or level of energy literally. These are just "abstractions grounded in aspects of the concrete events we can pick out" (p. 42). So are we back to the idea of a strictly formal theory without an ontology? Well, no, because there is an ontology for Mach. He held that forces, which manifest potential differences and their manifested qualities, "were very concretely real" (p. 46). So now we are back to a Newtonian concept, and a concept that seems to be just as anthropocentric as any of the others. Witness some of the language Banks uses to characterize such forces: "pushes, pulls, shocks, stresses, tension" (p. 46). How can one, initially at least, not understand these in terms of pushes, pulls, etc. on one's own body?

In fairness to Mach, one must acknowledge that he is groping for something he did not fully complete (I assume). Perhaps the completion would have left things clearer. And in fairness to Banks on all this, he has written a lot on Mach, so perhaps these matters are all clarified in that other literature. But they are not in this book.

Turning to James, Banks sees his main contribution to realistic empiricism (though Banks grants that James sometimes sounds like a panpsychist) as developing a direct realist account of perception and a causal theory of knowledge. James' direct realism trades on the realistic empiricist view that what distinguishes the physical from the mental has nothing to do with the intrinsic nature of the fundamental particulars (the 'event particulars') but rather with the causal/functional relations into which they enter. Some causal/functional networks are mental, and some are not. But this doesn't rule out the possibility that such causal/functional networks may sometimes overlap, and that a given event particular may simultaneously be a member of a mental network and a non-mental network. This is exactly what happens when someone perceives a physical object in his/her environment. The sensation involved in the perceiving is part of both the mind of the perceiver and the physical object perceived. This is direct perception with a vengeance!

As Banks sees it, this is on the right track, but he thinks there is a problem that needs to be addressed. The problem is that perception is not exhausted by sensation; it involves intellectual judgment about how the sensation is causally connected to other members of the network that constitutes the physical object perceived. But one doesn't experience these other members or the causal connections, so how can this be direct perception?

But has it ever been proposed that direct perception is supposed to mean that we have sensations of the whole object perceived at once? Granted, there may be subtle questions over how exactly to characterize the difference between direct and indirect perception, but certainly direct perception was never meant to be understood this robustly. And certainly James' account is robust enough. So I don't see the problem.

But even less do I understand Banks' solution. He proposes that in the case of hallucinations, judgments of perception do not occur, because the assertability conditions for such judgments are not fulfilled. Here he seems to have in mind something like Putnam's view that the contents of a judgment are determined by conditions 'outside the head'.[2] He then goes into a long dissertation on how, once one realizes that s/he has been subject to a hallucination, and thus has not made a perceptual judgment, one can retrospectively realize that, phenomenologically, the hallucination was different from a veridical perception.

I don't follow this at all. Banks doesn't make it clear why the (apparent) judgments associated with hallucinations are not false rather than empty of content. And even if they are empty of content, I don't follow this business of retrospectively seeing a phenomenological difference between it and a veridical perception. If that is possible, why couldn't one have seen this difference to begin with? And finally, I don't see how all this is supposed to solve the problem Banks thinks he sees anyway. Maybe I'm missing something here (I've been known to do that), but none of this comes across very clearly.

In Chapter 5, Banks builds upon and extends some of Russell's ideas to develop what he calls an 'enhanced physicalist' theory of mind. 'Standard physicalism' takes as its supervenience base just those properties that are dealt with in physical theory, which Russell (at one point) saw as confined to structural and causal properties. 'Enhanced physicalism' includes in the base the qualitative properties that, according to Russell, must constitute the intrinsic natures of the entities dealt with in physical theory even though such theory (as presently conceived, at least) ignores them. By so expanding the base (with Russell's 'intrinsic properties' being understood as the properties event particulars manifest, I take it) Banks hopes to be able to give a physicalist account of sensations and other qualitative mental events. But the physicalism that results must be, according to him, a posteriori. That is because when the fundamental event particulars combine into the causal-functional networks that constitute mentality, the qualities that are manifested are such that they cannot be explained in terms of and could not have been predicted from, the qualities manifested by the individual components when they are not in such a network. But this is still physicalism, says Banks, because in the conversion from the physical to the mental instantiations, energy is conserved.

What is not entirely clear is if Banks thinks that different causal powers, ones that cannot be explained from the physicalist (i.e., non-mental) base, emerge in this conversion. Banks in many ways sounds like an emergentist a la C. D. Broad. But he disavows this, saying that "the powers are the same in lower-level and in higher-level configured events" (p. 164). But this just may mean that energy is conserved.

If Banks does think different causal powers emerge in the mental networks, it is hard to see how his theory could be physicalist. As many see it, the issue at stake between physicalists and non-physicalists is precisely whether or not such different causal powers emerge with the mind. If Banks thinks his theory is physicalist he needs to say what he thinks the physicalism vs. non-physicalism issue is. (Of course, there is a fair amount of literature on this.)

But even leaving this aside, I'm not sure Banks can call himself a physicalist. There is still the problem of the explanatory gap between the lower-level and higher-level manifestations. Here Banks appeals to the fact that energy is conserved. But there is no obvious reason why a 'naturalistic dualist' (to borrow a term from David Chalmers) could not subscribe to conservation of energy. Of course, it would be conservation of natural energy, not physical energy. But one might argue that the transformation of one to the other is no less scientifically respectable than the transformation of kinetic to electrical energy, say. So one could plausibly argue that Banks' theory is a form of dualism.

I have said enough, I trust, to show that, despite its virtues, there are some significant problems with this book. Still, my bottom line recommendation is: read it, and see if you can figure these things out better than I have.

[1] Rudolf Carnap, "The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts", in Feigl and Scriven (ed.), Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Vol. I: The Foundations of Science and the Concepts of Psychology and Psychoanalysis, University of Minnesota Press (1956).

[2] Hilary Putnam, Reason, Truth and History, Cambridge University Press (1981).