The Reason Why: A Theory of Philosophical Explanation

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Edo Pivčević, The Reason Why: A Theory of Philosophical Explanation, KruZak, 2007, 298pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789536463407.

Reviewed by Joseph Margolis, Temple University


Edo Pivčević's The Reason Why is a thoroughly admirable book: absolutely straightforward and simple in argument, charmingly written, uncompromisingly legible but widely and tactfully informed, bent on asking and answering a single fundamental question usually cast as "metaphysical" or (after Kant) "epistemological", but, in Pivčević's hands, skillfully turned in what must be called a "pragmatist" direction. Careful readers may find (as I do) that the general lines of the argument are notably congruent with some of Charles Peirce's earliest accounts of the pragmatist treatment of "belief" or "believing-true" meant to displace the entire strategy of "proofs of truth" in the "metaphysical sense of proof" (24) that have been stalemated by the "skeptic's" countermeasures. Neither Peirce nor the leanest Hegel or Schelling whom Peirce invokes in his own critique of Kant's first Critique, which brings to a close the classic search for the metaphysics of certainty regarding the grounds of knowledge -- a search that moves (as Pivčević summarizes the tale, in Chapter 1) from Plato to Descartes to Kant -- ever makes an appearance in Pivčević's own text. But he launches thereby his own proposal and inquiry as to how to answer the question "why things are as they are or why the events around us occur as they do" (1), which he marks as the common concern of "natural science and religion" (v) and which philosophy probes by querying "presuppositions other disciplines leave untouched" (1). All this is laid out in the most explicit and spare way in the Preface and Chapter 1, which limn the structure of the entire book: an inquiry into the logic of "philosophical explanation." It's best to read these two short entries several times before reading on: once you have their lesson in hand, the rest of the book is entirely transparent -- transparently skillful and original in the mode of a pragmatist account that (as with Peirce again) discloses in a remarkably ramified way the "philosophical limitations" of a "naturalism" of an inclusively causal sort, which, as Pivčević says, "is for us here of main interest" (vi).

Here, then, are the main innovations of Pivčević's interesting argument. First: from the fact that "there is no prospect of finding out with certainty what the world is actually like as distinct from how it is merely thought or believed to be [it follows that] knowledge [construed] as an access to 'belief-independent' truth remains out of reach" (2). This, Pivčević argues, completely outflanks the skeptic's resources and, therefore, any need to continue with the hopeless search for ultimate "evidence" and "cognitive certainty" regarding truth and knowledge (2), a search that reaches its most attenuated and vulnerable form in Kant, read in the sense of its being impossible to distinguish convincingly between how the world "is" and how it merely "seems to be." Pivčević himself concludes that the skeptic is then stalemated by the implicit "solipsism" of his own position. This seems to me too glib, but in effect Pivčević incorporates the skeptic's effective challenge into his own position by construing truth in terms of "pragmatic utility" (6), which, since it raises the deeper question already remarked, exposes (in Pivčević's opinion) pragmatism's own insuperable limitations. This is the "second" step of the argument, which of course invites a closer comparison with Peirce's well-known original version of the pragmatist argument. Here, it may be remarked, Pivčević does indeed avoid, in discussing the "continuum" of inquiry, Peirce's confusion between mathematical and "dynamic" infinity (236). If we concede this much, Pivčević's resolution may be read as an improved form of a Peircean-like argument.

The "third" step consists in establishing that if we think of knowledge as "propositional knowledge," then, given the failure of the strategy of cognitive certainty or privilege, "the key task [that will need] to be addressed [will be seen to be] one of exploring the presuppositions of rational belief." Knowledge, then, will be explained in terms of "what can be rationally believed" -- which is of course the basic pragmatist move. Hence, the required explanation will have to "comply with certain basic rules of consistency" and will have to be "susceptible to a rational explanation" (2), which once again is notably closer to the Peircean commitment -- not least because it's tempted by ("abductive") guesses at rational necessity. This permits Pivčević to reach two conclusions rather quickly: one, that the argument has more to do with "logic" (the logic of rationality, so to say) than with "epistemology" (the logic of the certainty of truth [3]); and, for another, the line of reasoning will not be "naturalistic" (in the double sense of "naturalism's" favoring causal explanations over other kinds of explanation and, within these terms, of favoring "natural necessity" -- in effect, determinism -- over logically laxer forms of explanation [24-25]). Proofs, then, are out; explanations are in. "The question is not whether genuine knowledge can be had, but what kind of knowledge are we capable of having" (25-26).

Pivčević claims an enormous economy here: whatever counts as knowledge must depend on "the ultimate conditions that any rational belief must satisfy" (26); knowledge, then, is a discovery or construction (depending on what we take "the ultimate conditions" to be) of some subset of "believings-true." It's in this way that Pivčević arrives at the fourth and most original step of the argument, the nerve of the rest of the book. For the conditions he means to supply "represent" (he says) "a framework of ideas and principles which are all interdependent and mutually complementary, and require no 'external' justification." The framework he seeks will be "self-explanatory" -- may even allow us, derivatively, to recover (more manageably) the notion of "cognitive certainty" (26).

In the Preface, before any of the conceptual scaffolding (just given) is laid out, Pivčević makes it clear that the "logical" conditions a "rational explanation" of the sort he means to pursue will have the effect of explicating (in some measure to be made clear) "how the world is actually made up" -- in the process of providing "fundamental ideas and principles" (of the mutually complementary and interdependent sort) forming (in that way) "a self-supporting and self-explanatory analytical system" (v). The "fifth" step -- if I may call it that, the one that identifies the most distinctive feature of his intended argument, the key theme that will bear the chief burden of integrating the whole structure -- lies with featuring "the idea of self": that is, the idea of an "agent" capable of isolating the concepts required, and who alone "is able to think [in general] of him/herself as an example of a kind," which itself involves "an act of self-reference" (already "definitional … of selfhood") and implicated in the system to be constructed (v). This, then, accounts for Pivčević's special caveat against "naturalism"; for naturalistic explanations (perhaps Pivčević is thinking of the derivative but influential views of Rorty and Davidson) seek "factors that exist independently of the conditions under which they may [be] feature[d] as objects of belief, rational or otherwise" (v). I must say that I find this self-referential turn an extremely skillful, powerful and compelling, pared-down conception of the "internalism" of the classic pragmatist position, which (according to Pivčević) manifests itself in emergentist or evolutionary or (even) religiously ample terms, that expose the inherent limitations (even if pragmatist) of the naturalistic alternative (thus construed [v-vi]).

I've taken the trouble to spell out Pivčević's philosophical armature, because it provides the entire plan for the detailed inquiries that follow and for assessing the point and force of every element in his argument. For example, Pivčević demonstrates in a remarkably simple and compelling way that "there is no necessary connection between determinism and predictability, neither is there a necessary connection between determinism and causality." The first is "a typically logical notion" and the second, which is "bound up with the idea of order in time," depends on empirical contingencies or some such thing (93). His illustrations are often quite elegant and straightforward: "a prime number greater than 2 [for instance] does not 'cause' its even successor in the number series to come into being, even though its successor must be even." He draws from such considerations grounds for demonstrating how causality cannot be captured (except by ad hoc idealization) by deterministic rules and why "causal determinism makes no clear sense" at all (93-97). Or, again, he demonstrates very clearly "what distinguishes a [second-order how- or why-] philosophical explanation from [first-order] scientific how-explanations" (which go "operationalist" and "reductionist"), by simply noting that philosophical explanations ought not to be confused with or subsumed under scientific explanations since philosophy "seeks … to clarify how within the framework of the general conditions under which the world operates both these kinds of question [how- and why- questions, or, perhaps better, first- and second-order how-questions] can be significantly asked" (49). Answers to the questions of the latter sort count as illustrations of what Pivčević means by "a self-supporting and self-explanatory analytic system." Pivčević is at his best in explicating his model of philosophical explanation.

It's Pivčević's economies, moving in this direction, that are most attractive. Perhaps a final illustration will confirm the uniform thrust of the first half of the book, which pursues its topics in a relentless and seemingly unavoidable way. Thus: having (as we've seen) denied any entailment between "the principle of universal causation and determinism," Pivčević presses on to suggest, plausibly enough, that if we view logical necessity as "non-natural" (in effect, non-causal), then there's no evidence that there is any confirmable "natural" necessity to be had (99)! I find this splendidly simple (and, once again, a reminder of Peirce's earlier insistence on the same matter). Here, Pivčević invokes his idea of a system of rational explanation; for, if there are any "necessary propositions," they would have to be "self-explanatory" if our account of them were ever to be "full and complete" (100). But, in the absence of adequate evidence, determinism fails. So Pivčević picks up on the advantage gained by distinguishing between logical and factual matters, between necessity and contingency -- ultimately, then, between "propositions" and "states of affairs" (100). Very trim: in this way, supporting both logical ("essentialist") truths and factual ("empirical") truths, through a review of some of Kant's and Leibniz's distinctions, Pivčević easily rejects any "reductionism" that would opt for an exclusive preference for one or the other of these two categories. The conclusions are familiar, of course, but Pivčević's particular skill rests with his spare way of recovering these commonplaces for his own original strategy.

In bringing the first part of the book to a close, he at once sets the problems for its second half. Thus far, he favors "the 'middle-path' approach," which resists favoring either reductionism or "anti-reductionism" according to the distinctions given (145-146); but then he acknowledges that, in conceding that much, he leaves unresolved "the problem of what does or does not qualify as a rational and comprehensive explanation." Nevertheless, he's managed to demonstrate that "naturalism" (in his sense) will never be able to bring the matter to a satisfactory close (146). This, then, sets the agenda for Part II.

The rest of the book moves pointedly (and forcefully) to the findings of the final chapter (Ch. 12: "Explanation and Understanding"). Here, Pivčević arrives at a number of conclusions that are distinctively his, are certainly worth the labor, are entitled to a proper hearing, are at the cutting edge of the sequel to Kantian transcendental questions; and yet these may not quite lead to the necessary truths he finally draws. Here I should like to give Pivčević his due in an open-ended way that acknowledges what I can only call "working" aporiai and antimonies (which I judge he never quite resolves). At the very least, Part I of the book does not quite prepare us for the strenuous claims of Part II.  Furthermore, these claims are all of a notably troublesome sort -- in which we are drawn to allow them as (potentially) a priori truths that we nevertheless fear we may be forced to recant or revise without assurance that we will ever come to the end of our doubts.

Pivčević gives us an exemplary set of "basic categories" that (he assures us) form part of his would-be "logically self-supporting analytic system," itself " inseparable from the idea of self as an experienced unity of biographical time" (219-220). He offers "four interrelated pairs of such categories": the "dichotomy of specimens and species, which is implicit in the use of concepts"; the dichotomy between identity and difference which not only underpins the notion of an extra-conceptual reality but helps to show why a multi-perspectival view of such a reality is not only possible but necessary; a "third dichotomy … between continuity and discreteness, which lies at the root of all accounts of the phenomena of change and order in time"; and a "fourth … dichotomy between whole and part, which underlies any analytic explanatory effort, while at the same time setting strict limits to what any 'reductionist' explanation is able to achieve" (219-220). Pivčević holds that these categories (and others like them) "inform all rational accounts of phenomena and are mutually complementary and interdependent" -- and implicate the inseparable idea of self without assuring it of any "logical pre-eminence" (220).

It appears that, without these and similar distinctions -- as, for instance, with specimens and species -- "there can be no conceptual thought and nothing could be intelligibly asserted about anything" (220). Now, I am myself persuaded (by an argument advanced by Hilary Putnam regarding "conceptual truths" -- think of Kant's conviction, in the middle of the 18th century, of the impossibility of conceiving the negation of the Euclidean theorem regarding the sum of the angles of a triangle) that a "conceptual truth" at time t may, through historical discoveries, cease to be such a truth at t′ later than t and that we cannot know in advance how such truths may be overtaken. That is, I don't deny that Pivčević's categories appear to yield "conceptual truths" but they all seem open to open-ended revision and qualification that threaten to approach vacuity or something as forceful as the examples of non-Euclidean geometry. Consider, here, how Pivčević proceeds: "To say of an x that it is F [he explains] is to subsume that x under the concept F: it is to include it into the class of items over which that concept ranges." But he also asks: "what exactly does F in 'x is F' stand for, if anything?" (221). I confess I have no clear idea of what a "concept" is here (or anywhere), nor do I think has anyone. In fact, I'm convinced, faute de mieux, that there probably can't be any rule-like formulation that could ever stand as an a priori truth of the kind Pivčević wants -- ultimately, an algorithmic or rule-like grasp of predicative generality: I take generality to be, inherently ("logically"), insuperably informal. This holds true as well of all of his categories, though I agree that each is a rough exemplar of a family of distinctions that we "must" make use of!

Take another case. Pivčević summarizes a compelling (and familiar) argument against an "unrestricted holism" encompassing all rational beliefs: "that every propositional belief depends for its meaning upon the entire system of beliefs, such that one cannot properly understand any belief without understanding all of them, is not a position that can be consistently entertained" (258). Entirely reasonable. But then, he offers in its place what he calls a "structuralist holism"; namely, the thesis that "if the concept of rational explanation is to have a clear meaning at all, then there must be a fixed structure of inter-related categories and corresponding principles [a holist 'core'] which does not, and moreover cannot, change or be altered" (258). But if what I have already offered (just above) is conceded to be true, then such a core cannot be pertinently assured -- and need not be. I suggest that this counterclaim goes antinomically contrary to Pivčević's opposition to his own pragmatist proclivities.

The fault I see here might be totted up to the absence of any account of historicity in Pivčević's appraisal of a system of rational belief. The importance of this lacuna makes itself felt in Pivčević's intriguing but incompletely developed notion of the "idea of the self." He needs, as he says, "the idea of an 'empirical' or 'existential' rather than … a 'transcendental' self" -- "a historically unique self"; but he does not pursue the clue sufficiently (212). If he had, I think he would have had to change decisively his favored notion of a "structuralist holism" and the entire model of the rational explanation of belief.

But to contest these claims this way is merely to match the high compliment due to Pivčević's admirable ingenuity. Pivčević has mounted a genuinely worthwhile challenge here.