The Reception of the Galilean Science of Motion in Seventeenth-Century Europe

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Carla Rita Palmerino and J.M.M.H. Thijssen, eds., The Reception of the Galilean Science of Motion in Seventeenth-Century Europe, Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Vol. 239, Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2004, 287 pp., $109.00 (hbk), ISBN 1402024541.

Reviewed by Joseph C. Pitt, Virginia Tech


In 1976 a workshop on Galileo was held at Virgina Tech. On the final day of that workshop two questions were posed, "Why were there no Galileans? What happened to Galileo's science?" Almost thirty years later we finally have some answers. The Reception of the Galilean Science of Motion in Seventeenth-Century Europe consists of a collection of articles arising out of a colloquium organized by the editors in Amsterdam in July 2000. It reveals a clearly thought through approach to attempting to tackle its theme, which it succeeds in doing admirably. The papers start with a look at the state of affairs at the beginning of the 17th century and take us through to the end of that century. Throughout the papers are scattered the cast of characters that attempted to struggle not only with Galileo's ideas, but with his commitment to a new way to do what was to become physics. We find that while there were disciples of Galileo, they were few and did not so much defend the master's ideas, as work to make them viable in an atmosphere of evolving and competing conceptions and tools. Likewise, we find that it wasn't so much that there was no Galilean science, but that it was absorbed into something bigger and more comprehensive than merely the science of motion.

We start with Alan Gabbey setting the context -- rejecting anachronistic terms like "mechanical philosophy" and "mathematical mechanics" for a more nuanced and contextualized look at the state of natural philosophy and mechanics in the 17th century. What Gabbey argues for is a sense of the times as producing a new way of thinking about the world that emerged in the work of Galileo, Descartes, Newton and others, which phenomenon was messy and slow to congeal. Essentially Gabbey is arguing that the emergence of terminology to capture this or that movement is a complicated process that requires something going on, but what that something is takes time to clarify. Thus Gabbey sorts through various meanings of the term "mechanics", distinguishing Galileo's technical sense from Descartes' developing idea of "mechanical" that makes a mathematical science of motion possible.

Sophie Roux continues the focus on the role of Descartes and his developing conception of "mechanical." She looks at what she calls the two worlds of mechanics Descartes inhabited, one concerned with the general idea of mechanics in which there is a programmatic identity of physics and mechanics, and the other which is close to the old practice of statics. It is through the correspondents that Descartes interacted with that we see the development of his thought as Roux explores the problem of heaviness.

William Shea, the current dean of Galileo scholars, takes on the complicated project of determining if Descartes in fact developed his own version of the law of free fall prior to Galileo, showing definitively that he did not. What Shea makes clear are some of the problems created by working out of one framework while striving to develop another. Thus, the young Descartes, a product of a scholastic education, tried to solve the problem of free fall by invoking the old impetus theory. But even when he abandons it, striving to develop a fully mathematical science, he retains some of the old preconceptions that continue to hamper him.

H. Floris Cohen continues the theme of a clash of conceptions of science, accepting the unsettled intellectual atmosphere of the times. Cohen's main objective is to present an analytical framework for doing the kind of history he proposes to do, i.e., one which reveals the complex and confusing nature of the times. He begins by focusing on schools of thought originating in Athens and Alexandria, showing how they develop in relative isolation from one another and how difficult it was for fusions of the two modes of thought to occur. He credits Galileo with that achievement by recognizing the difference between nature seen mathematically and the nature of everyday reality.

In their contribution, Jochen Büttner, Peter Damerow, and Jürgen Renn argue for a system of shared knowledge amongst the participants in the discussions over motion in the 17th century, one created by correspondence and the free exchange of ideas more than through publication. Their point is to lay the foundation for an exploration of the resistance to Galileo's ideas by showing that many of the objections raised against Galileo were explored by Galileo himself in some of these unpublished but often shared texts. This is also a theme pursued by Enrico Giusti with respect to Galileo's interactions with Torricelli, Sarpi, and Cavalieri. He shows that in these exchanges, as opposed to full treatises, there is a working out of ideas that only eventually find their way into the Discorsi.

One of the major defenders of Galileo outside of Italy was Gassendi. Carla Rita Palmerino gives an in-depth analysis of his two letters, first laying out Gassendi's proof that a ball dropped from the top of a mast of a ship in motion falls directly down at the bottom of the mast and then his discussion of the implications of these results. Palmerino seeks to answer the question of what attracted Gassendi to Galileo's work and what resulted from his attempt to provide a causal account of motion for Galileo. This is a theme picked up by Cees Leijenhorst in his examination of Hobbes' defense of Galileo, and Hobbes' efforts to find a causal account for the odd-number law. These attempts to find causal bases for Galileo's mathematical proposals are interesting in more ways than one, for Galileo eschewed causal explanation, confining himself to mathematical description.

As we move toward the end of the 17th Century, Christiane Vilain examines Christian Huygens' proof of Galileo's odd-number law, revealing the life-long influence of Galileo's methods on Huygens. Wallace Hooper moves in a slightly different direction by focusing on the various theories of the tides available at the time. Galileo saw his theory of the tides, as presented in Day 4 of Dialogo, as the finishing touch in his defense of Copernicus, even though it was seriously flawed. Nevertheless it provides a distinctive application of some of his views on motion and Hooper provides us with an excellent review.

The books ends with a discussion by Michel Blay of Pierre Varignon's account of the science of motion using the mathematics of the differential calculus then available. Varignon reworked some of Newton's ideas on central forces and in so doing managed to redirect research on this topic.

In the end we have a wealth of material here, impeccably researched and beautifully presented. We know who the players were and how they interacted and what they had in common and where they got a lot of what they knew. We watch the processes by which Galileo's ideas are dispersed, assessed, reformulated and finally absorbed into something far larger than Galileo imagined, a general mathematical science. The focus on a specific topic, Galileo's science of motion, was well conceived, for it serves as a wedge used to pry open many of the complicated factors contributing to the events and discoveries that made the 17th century so special. The essays in this book, taken together, show us what it takes to do serious history of science and the volume should be welcomed as an important addition to our understanding of that history.