The Reflective Life: Living Wisely With Our Limits

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Valerie Tiberius, The Reflective Life: Living Wisely With Our Limits, Oxford University Press, 2008, 222pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199202867.

Reviewed by Remy Debes, University of Memphis


How to live? That grand and enduring question is the focus of Valerie Tiberius's new book, which brings together two trends in ethics -- epistemic virtue theory and conscientious treatment of empirical psychology -- to offer an intriguing, ambitious, out-of-the-armchair theory of the good life. She calls it, "Reflective Wisdom."

Three features distinguish Tiberius's argument beyond her substantive conclusions. Most generally, her account is marked by an explicit disavowal of a comprehensive account of the ends of life. The book is not an inquiry into the aim of life. It's not a "target" account (as she calls it). Instead, Tiberius is concerned to say quite literally how we should live. In her words, it's a "process" account of the good life. It's a normative theory about how to choose the goods of life, not what to choose. Tiberius argues that persons should choose goods using appropriate reflection, where this amounts to broadly epistemically virtuous reflection. To motivate and defend the particular dictates of reflective virtue, Tiberius relies on a complicated coherence account of justification. That coherence theory is the second major feature of her argument. The last distinctive feature is Tiberius's self-identified Humeanism. In her view, Reflective Wisdom is in one way or other, from top to bottom, in the Humean spirit.

The book begins with, and really is driven by, a sustained analysis of how ordinary agents actually guide their lives. The first section of the book is devoted to careful inquiry into the first-personal nature of value commitments: what a value commitment is, the nature of its authority, and the normative grounds for committing to, revising, or abandoning any given value. From here, Tiberius proceeds in the second and longest section to defend four substantive virtues of Reflective Wisdom: "attentional flexibility," "perspective," "optimism," and "self-awareness." She concludes the book with two theoretical discussions. The first explores the relationship between Reflective Wisdom and morality. The second is a defense of her effort to construct normative theory from a naturalistic account of good living.

Ultimately, the three major sections of the book seem somewhat disjointed in the sense that each could very nearly be approached in its own right. Indeed, as I move on to my critical comments, I'll simply treat each section in turn. That said, there is much of value in the individual parts, especially the more theoretical first and third sections. Tiberius offers keen insights on a wide scope of philosophical issues that promise to engage an equally wide audience. Still, there are some difficulties that should be addressed.

Section One: Tiberius's account of value commitments (which I'll sometimes just call the account of value) is influenced overtly and subtly by her Humean convictions. Three particular Humean characteristics stand out. In the first place, Tiberius takes Hume to have advocated at the close of the Treatise the basic demand for good living she defends, namely that to live well is to live a life that "can bear your reflective survey" (12). Second, Tiberius's persistent concern to treat empirical psychology as a constraint on normative theory resonates with Hume's empiricism. Thus she argues at several junctures that a plausible normative theory for how to live must fit with our best understanding of the natural world, which includes our best understanding of how minds like ours actually work. But Tiberius's approach is even more deeply Humean. She intends, thirdly, a Humean account of normativity itself.

Central to Tiberius's strategy is a complicated coherence theory, which explicitly is manifest midway through Chapter 2 and comes to the fore again (though less explicitly) in Chapter 8, the close of the book. Tiberius unfortunately never pauses to offer a dedicated discussion of coherence. There is no chapter, section heading, or even index reference to coherence. The reader is consequently burdened with puzzling out the details of coherence, which is a bit off-putting given that Tiberius claims that "all aspects" of Reflective Wisdom depend on those details (35). In any event, this much is clear: According to Tiberius, what makes for appropriate reflection is determined by those reflective considerations that successfully balance the values we actually have. That is, appropriate reflection is determined by those considerations, which from the reflective stance of ordinary individuals bring our values into coherence. Why? Because, a coherent value system is one that we can reflectively endorse. And why accept this further claim? This, I think, is the bedrock theoretical question for Tiberius. As I read her, she has two related answers.

First, Tiberius claims that implicit in a person's having any reflective values (i.e. a consequence of having endorsed at least some values) is a commitment to the substantive values of "life-satisfaction" and "self-direction" (35). And life-satisfaction and self-direction, she argues, in turn imply a demand for coherence. Second, the fundamental properties of value commitments themselves point to coherence. That is, the properties that characterize the nature of "value commitment" imply a coherence account of endorsement for those commitments. Whether one accepts Tiberius's overall argument will depend largely on whether one accepts these two claims. So let me put a little pressure on each.

Begin with life-satisfaction. If we share with Hume a serious concern with living a life that can bear our reflective scrutiny, then we must, Tiberius argues, already be committed to the value of life-satisfaction. The idea is that as persons concerned with living well by reflection we are already committed to a certain kind of compatibility between our value commitments and what she calls our "affective orientation." Value commitments need to be "confirmed in experience" in the sense that we have positive affective responses when pursuing them (32). Hence the claim that coherence serves as a normative constraint for reflective value: the coherence is between our affective responses during reflection and our actual value commitments. Tiberius explains, "[O]ne of the standards that our values can be held to is that we enjoy their pursuit, find them rewarding, and the like" (32).

I have no objection to the general "implicit value" strategy or the conclusion that the particular value of life-satisfaction points towards a normative coherence theory. But I don't think Tiberius offers a sufficient explanation of what "life-satisfaction" amounts to. She says that it's part cognitive, part affective (36). Is it then, two attitudes? Or do these parts combine in the form of one new cognitive emotion? These questions are complicated by the fact that it's not easy to say what Tiberius thinks an emotion is (the reader will note the absence in her bibliography of nearly all major philosophical or psychological theoretical works on emotion). This is potentially a serious lacuna given how frequently Tiberius talks of emotion throughout the book. In the argument on life-satisfaction, in particular, Tiberius freely interchanges the terms "response," "affective response," "emotion," and "attitude" -- but these aren't obviously equivalent. Moreover, she sometimes leans towards a cognitive conception of emotion and sometimes towards a non-cognitive one. For example, "satisfaction" is often talked about as if it were an affective primitive, that is, as a distinctive or peculiar sentiment. Telling against this interpretation is the psychological research Tiberius appeals to in order to explain life-satisfaction. This research talks of "global" satisfaction measured by a five-point questionnaire -- E. Diener's Satisfaction With Life Scale, or SWLS. But with one exception the SWLS looks wholly cognitive. The one exception is a question asking whether "I am satisfied with my life." Obviously that won't help explain what life-satisfaction consists in. To be fair, Tiberius admits early on that the affective component of satisfaction (whatever it is) isn't captured by the SWLS. However, by focusing the bulk of her discussion around the SWLS, I think Tiberius loses track of that early insight. At least, she never returns to say what the peculiar affect is.

Now a comment on value commitments per se: Tiberius argues that stability, volitional efficacy, and justifiability are the three general properties of value commitments. Stability is especially important, for it stands in a "reciprocal" relationship with justification (31). By this Tiberius does not intend a bi-conditional. Instead, considerations of stability and justification bear on or "sustain" each other. Equally important, value commitments always potentially serve as reasons for other value commitments. Taken together, we (very) roughly get an account like this: when we reflect on a given value in an effort to estimate whether it's worth endorsing, we seem to be asking a question of justification. But to ask this is to invite questions of stability, not only about the value in question, but also of other values. The demand for coherence is thus implied by the fundamental nature of value.

The full argument on value is perhaps Tiberius's most interesting. However, I can't let pass certain ironies in that argument. First, Hume himself made much of stability and Tiberius seems unaware of this. Granted, Hume doesn't lean on the explicit rubric "stability." But careful reading reveals Hume's disposition to cash out justification in terms of stability. Louis Loeb's recent book Stability and Justification in Hume's Treatise (OUP, 2002) brought this aspect of Hume into the limelight of Hume scholarship. Given Tiberius's self-identification as a Humean together with the centrality of stability to her own theory, it seems reasonable to expect her to show some familiarity with Loeb's argument. (Nothing by Loeb appears in the bibliography.) But this isn't a mere complaint of historical scholarship. Hume's own account heavily stressed two pressures on stability that Tiberius is virtually silent on. One is the importance of the viewpoint of the "judicious spectator" or "common viewpoint," as Hume alternatively referred to it. Perhaps Tiberius considers this aspect of Hume as of a piece with the kind of reflective idealizations she rejects. But on the one hand, even if that were accurate, it seems strange that a self-identified Humean concerned with "perspective" wouldn't devote space to Hume's particular, sanguine account of such spectatorship. On the other hand, it's simply not clear that Hume intends ideal spectatorship anyway. Not if that means full information and perfect rationality. On the contrary, the central function of that viewpoint seems, for Hume, its facilitation of impartiality. And it's not obvious to me that impartiality as Hume discussed it is meant as a case of ideal rationality.

Another major pressure on stability according to Loeb's reading of Hume is sympathy. In Book 3 of the Treatise, Hume stresses the value of belief or judgment to withstand inter-subjective sympathetic contradiction (keep in mind that, for Hume, moral judgments are emotions). Now, Tiberius does attempt to include sympathy in her own theory. But there are some problems with her discussion. In the first place it's not exactly clear what Tiberius takes "sympathy" to be. Like coherence, there is no dedicated discussion. She seems to use the term in connection with simulationist language, treating "sympathy" as what most moral psychologists and philosophers of mind now call "empathy" (or a kind of empathy), namely, as the means by which we conceptualize the viewpoints of other persons, and, at least typically, come to share their mental states. If this is what Tiberius intends, then it would keep her in line with Hume, who clearly thought of "sympathy" as a kind of empathy -- albeit under a contagion model, not a simulation model (a further point Tiberius doesn't notice).

However, even assuming that Tiberius is thinking of sympathy as a kind of empathy, she still treats sympathy as a limited epistemic tool subserving a particular virtue. Sympathy is discussed in terms of a merely informational capacity to identify what others value that helps us develop "perspective" on our own values (96). (She does return to discuss sympathy in Chapter 7, but only briefly, and if anything moves away from the idea of empathy.) Most important, Tiberius makes no effort to connect sympathy to stability at a fundamental level -- which brings me back to the irony at hand. If Loeb is right, as I'm inclined to believe, Hume thought sympathy qua empathy had a major impact on stability in general. The point again is not simply that we must wonder why Tiberius doesn't more clearly connect her theory to Hume's where they obviously overlap. In the light of Hume's arguments, we must wonder what Tiberius thinks of the connection between sympathy and stability generally.

Section Two: I would hope it is clear by now that Tiberius's basic strategy for defending her substantive conclusions about the virtues is to argue that certain virtues are motivated by their contribution to reflective coherence. I have no objection to that strategy and I won't attempt to discuss all four virtues she defends. But I do have specific reservations about two of her conclusions, one each for the virtues of "attentional flexibility" and "perspective."

My first complaint is really just a minor lament. Attentional flexibility reflects the idea that the wise person must know when not to reflect -- i.e. when to be "in the moment." This is not all that attentional flexibility requires, but it's arguably the most important. It's also plausible and interesting. However, the idea of being "in the moment" struck me as offering Tiberius grounds for a much more creative and far-reaching discussion than she provides. In particular, the idea is important to Asian virtue ethics, be it Buddhist, Confucian, or Taoist. Lao Tzu in particular makes much of it. Given the growing interest in finding common ground between Western and Eastern Philosophy, I think Tiberius missed an opportunity.

Regarding the virtue of perspective, Tiberius argues that the wise person must keep in view what is "really" important by assessing the relative importance of various values considered from her own reflective stance and then correspondingly adjust her attitudes. In particular, the wise person mustn't dwell on matters of little worth, allow small personal injuries to blind her to great sufferings by others, or allow what she admits to be of smaller significance to distract her attentionally from the pursuit or enjoyment of greater values.

These dictates seem rather obvious, and I think the argument for this particular virtue will struggle to impress readers. That risk is compounded by what I think is an error in one of the more interesting claims Tiberius does make about perspective: its connection with sympathy, which was foreshadowed above. Tiberius argues that sympathy -- by which it will be recalled I'm taking her to mean a kind of empathy -- is "required" for developing the virtue of perspective (96). But it's hard to see why this is so.

On the one hand Tiberius argues that sympathy is required for "remembering" the weights of our values: we need it to take us out of moments of obsession with the trivial (96). Now, sympathy certainly could do this by presenting within experience information about what other people value, and thereby giving us a comparative prompt for self-reflection. But it seems unlikely that only sympathy could do this. Suppose I'm a Taoist (to beat the same drum). I think material gain, competition, and fame are all bunk values. I also know that my emotions usually signal that I'm prizing something material, or am worried about my comparative social or professional status, or am concerned with a perceived slight against my reputation, etc. Isn't it plausible, then, that in order to "remind" myself of what I value I could cognitively cultivate an epistemic habit of second-guessing all my emotional responses? Granted, this habit may not be perfectly reliable. But then again, neither is sympathy, as the collective history of humankind has proven many times over.

On the other hand, Tiberius argues sympathy is necessary for the "interpersonal expression of understanding the importance of one's own values" (96). But ultimately, I simply couldn't follow Tiberius's meaning here. It was unclear to me, from what she says about sympathy and perspective, how Reflective Wisdom (as a subjectively focused theory of reflective endorsement) motivates or grounds a requirement for the interpersonal expression of such endorsement.

Section Three: Tiberius closes the book with a different sort of problem entirely. She wonders why we should treat reflection as authoritative in the first place. In particular, she worries aloud about whether coherence underwrites the authority of reflective standards and virtues only insofar as we already want to live a life that can "bear our reflective scrutiny." If we really aren't concerned to live such a life, then is the ultimate source of normativity for reflective virtue undercut? The point is that Reflective Wisdom looks dangerously contingent in virtue of making a desire its ultimate basis.

Some of the moves Tiberius makes to answer this worry are familiar -- modifications of expressivist strategies tailored to her particular theory. Others are novel. All are provocative. The most important is her emphasis on a distinction between the arbitrary and the contingent. Tiberius argues that only the former presents a fundamental threat to a strategy that bases normative authority on desire. She then attempts to persuade us that the desire to live a reflective life, although contingent, is not arbitrary. The desire to live a reflective life is partly constitutive of being a reflective person. If this sounds like the echo of Korsgaard, it is. Tiberius thinks she can borrow from Korsgaard to articulate a kind of Humean "constructivism." Interestingly, as Tiberius notes, Korsgaard has elsewhere argued that Humean accounts are hamstringed by reflective regress problems when it comes to justification. So if Tiberius is right, we need to rethink the merits of Korsgaard's (influential) accusation.

Ultimately, I'm inclined to agree with Tiberius. But I have two complaints. First, I don't think Tiberius says enough about the relationship between Humean constructivism and Kantian constructivism. Are they necessarily mutually exclusive? I don't see that they are, and it isn't clear how Tiberius comes down on this important question. Second, Tiberius's argument is brief. I'd have liked greater proportional attention to this very intriguing part of her thesis. Perhaps Tiberius will make the conclusion of her book a cornerstone for future work. If she does, I'm convinced of this much after reading her new book: we have good reason to pay attention to anything further Tiberius has to say.