The Relationship Between the Physical and the Moral in Man

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Maine de Biran, The Relationship Between the Physical and the Moral in Man, Darian Meacham and Joseph Spadola (eds., trs.), Bloomsbury, 2016, 224pp. $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781350020306.

Reviewed by Antonio Calcagno, King's University College, Canada


French spiritualist thought, which includes the works of figures like François-Pierre-Gonthier Maine de Biran, Victor Cousin, and Félix Ravaisson-Mollien, and which inspired thinkers like Jules Lachelier, Henri Bergson, Jean Nabert, Vladimir Jankélévitch, and Michel Henry, formed in large part as a response to what philosophers saw as a reductionist materialist, empiricist view of reality developed by thinkers like Étienne Bonnot de Condillac and later Auguste Comte. Spiritualists defend the distinction between matter and spirit, arguing that spirit or intellect has a unique life of its own that is not reducible to the body or the laws of physics. Furthermore, spirit can influence the body and psyche. Biran (1766-1824) can be considered one of the founding fathers of the spiritualist school and his influence on contemporary phenomenology, though understudied, has been immense, especially in the work of Henry. The present volume is both a welcome and excellent translation of one of Biran's more important works. It not only consists of the philosopher's texts but also includes significant essays that help elucidate the origin and form of the text, its ideas, and the historical and philosophical impact of the text in its day, within phenomenology, and within the history of philosophy.

Darian Meacham's preface sets the stage for the volume. He highlights how recent French phenomenology, especially the thought of Henry and Merleau-Ponty, owe much to the insights of Biran in terms of our understanding of sensation, the feeling of living, and the experience of the lived body. The editor also a brief history of the origin and legacy of Biran's essay while highlighting its relevance for contemporary philosophy in general:

The Relationship between the Physical and the Moral in Man is intended to provide a path into Biran's thought for English-speaking readers. We clearly think that reading and understanding Biran's work is an essential aspect of understanding the development of nineteenth-century French philosophy, the reception of Kant and Leibniz in France, and also the immense influence that the tradition of French spiritualism (of which, properly speaking, Biran is the originator) has had on the development of twentieth-century philosophy, where the problem of the mind-body relation and the question of what dimension of explanation is appropriate to the phenomenon of the will and the experience of effort remain alive and kicking. (17-18)

The second chapter of the book, which was written by Jeremy Dunham, provides a timeline that chronicles both the important points in the life of Biran and the influence of Biran on the larger spiritualist tradition, which ends with the 1995 publication of Gilles Deleuze's "L'immanence: une vie . . . " (23). Chapter 3 consists of a small philological text of F.C.T. Moore that helps explain the history, context and critical apparatus employed in establishing the French manuscript that serves as the base text for the English translation. Chapter 4 of the volume consists of an essay by early modern philosophy scholar Delphine Antoine-Mahut in which she explains the place of Biran within the French spiritualist tradition. Antoine-Mahut also highlights the influence of Cousin, who was Biran's editor, on his legacy. She argues that Cousin's editing of Biran's work inadvertently restricted his legacy and place within French philosophy. Instead, she maintains that the new critical edition of Biran's work allows one to see that

Contrary to Cousin's historiography, the history of modern thought, according to Biran, must therefore make room for authors such as Thomas Willis (1621-1675), Georg Ernst Stahl (1659-1734), David Hartley (1705-1757), Charles Bonnet (1720-1793), François Gigot de Lapeyronie (1678-1747), Marie-François Xavier Bichat (1771-1802), Philippe Pinel (1745-1826) or further Franz Joseph Gall (1758-1828) -- that is, those whom dominant or institutional thought strives to expel from the corpus of 'philosophy'. In contemporary terms, we could say that Biran is one of the first defenders of the fertility of an interdisciplinary approach to the human being, and that this interdisciplinary approach is for him the only measure of the scientific status of the psychology he promoted. (46)

Chapter 5 of the volume consists of Biran's essay, which won a prize from the Academy of Copenhagen in 1812. The text is divided into two sections. The first section has three articles and opens with a discussion of causality and how it is used to falsely justify certain relations between things and/or events, which may also lead to a false appraisal of the nature of a thing or event. Biran remarks of Cartesian physics:

"We have already noted that the explanation of a physical phenomenon in the Cartesian doctrine consisted not only in determining the natural cause on which this phenomenon depends, but furthermore in demonstrating or imagining in detail how this cause acted to produce the effect in question . . . all things that the imagination can conceive but that neither the senses nor experience can verify. (52)

When it comes to the physicists and philosophers of fact, like Bacon and Newton, Biran observes,

We can also see how this latest intellectual development in the sciences of fact, which we characterize under the heading search for causes, does not prevail, strictly speaking . . . Indeed, this search reduces to a simple generalization or classification of natural phenomenon, that is, to moving from effect to effect until it reaches the most general effect from which the particular ones derived and in which they are assumed to be contained. (53)

The reductive explanation of things and events to either Cartesian internal sense or external facts, according to Biran, is not sufficient to account for the reality of things, for explanation itself becomes limited to the frameworks of general laws and a "search for causes" (54). Biran takes a quick tour through the history of ancient and modern philosophy to show how the overemphasis of laws and causality have limited our understanding of phenomena. In particular, he objects to the reduction of sensation, willing, habit, and thinking to mere physical processes or metaphysical unities of causation that inevitably occlude the possibility of the sentiment of the self (53). The remainder of Part One of Biran's essay explores physicalist, animist (i.e., exclusively soul-based accounts of perception sensation and willing) and craniological (what today we would perhaps call 'brain-based') accounts of intellectual or spiritual phenomena like sensation, willing, the feeling of embodiment, and sensations of the self and living: all are shown to be limited positions that tend to emphasise a restricted sense of causality or lawfulness.

Part Two of Biran's essay develops and defends his spiritualist position, which does not deny the role of nature or physics, the brain, or our psychology in shaping what and who we are, but the philosopher will also point out that these aspects in and of themselves are not sufficient to account for the complexity and organisation of the human being, which ultimately point to the distinct existence of a spiritual or intellectual aspect of humanity. The first few sections of the second part look at the affects of sensations that stem from hearing, sight, and touch. All of these senses communicate, for Biran, not only objects and data of sensation, but they also transmit, symbolise and can produce in us affects that express more than simple objects of sensations. For example, the hearing of certain sounds uttered by those who are suffering can instill in us a feeling of sympathy, which can evoke in us a moral sentiment (114-115). Biran observes,

Nature seems to have linked to each passion a particular accent that expresses it and made all those capable of understanding its sign sympathize with it . . . Such is also the extraordinary influence of those impassioned orators, who must learn to seize the inflections fit for moving the soul and to imitate or reproduce the sympathetic signs linked by nature to each of the passions he wishes to arouse. Such is that magic power not only of articulate speech as a symbol of intelligence, but of the accented voice as a talisman of sensitivity. (114)

The last section of the second part focuses on internal sensations produced by living, wakefulness or consciousness, sleep, dreaming and imagination. One feels, according to Biran, the effects of these aspects of our humanity and they can have a profound impact on how we live and experience ourselves and our bodies. For example, feelings of calm, serenity, pleasure, self-confidence, effort, willing, and discouragement are not merely the results of nerve or brain stimulation, for they require symbolic and intellectual constituents to be actualised. Often our sense impressions will affect accompanying sensations that are more than just the communication of some kind of stimulation or data of perception. Biran notes,

Each of us can observe in himself that the direct perceptions of the senses, the images of intuition, as well as the most elaborate ideas of intelligence, received, produced and contemplated in turn with variable internal affective dispositions, for instance, with an immediate sentiment of well-being or of discomfort, of extreme force or of weakness, of self-confidence or of discouragement, of activity or of indolence, in sum of organic equilibrium or of organic turmoil -- that the perceptions, I say, or intellectual ideas corresponding to each of these affective states, seem to adapt to the internal tenor of internal sensitivity and to taint itself as it were its distinctive colours; this, in passing, is a notable circumstance that gives our moral and psychological ideas in particular such a variable form in certain individuals, or in the same individual at different times, and that as a result prevents certain truths of consciousness or of intimate sense from equally penetrating into all minds, from there enjoying an equal clarity even when expressed unequivocally . . . (131-132)

That we can experience an inner sense of ourselves and our awareness, for Biran, shows that we have a self that comes to display itself in the spiritual aspects of our humanity. His argument for the possibility of a distinctly spiritual or intellectual aspect of our humanity rests on the complexity of sensation, imagination, willing and effort that work with the intellect to produce in us particular inner sensations or awareness of a self that is embodied, alive, thinking, imagining and willing. Biran maintains:

But suppose we give the science called psychology an extension that indeed seems attributable to it, understanding by this term not only the phenomena distinctive of the self and internal sense, or the products of the activity of willing and of thought, but in addition all the passive affections of animal sensitivity, which precede, prepare and perhaps bring about the constitution of the person in time (amènent dans le temps la constitution personelle), the obscure perceptions that only need a ray of light of consciousness to illuminate, develop and rise up to the height of the idea . . . (102)

The last three chapters (6-8) of the volume consist of scholarly essays. Pierre Montebello's essay is a commentary on Biran's essay and will help readers navigate the terminology, argument, and ideas of the philosopher's essay. Dunham's essay on Leibniz and Biran not only shows the deep connection between the two early modern philosophers but also explains how Biran was crucial in introducing a certain reception of Leibniz in France. The final essay by Pierre Kerszberg demonstrates how Biran's essay and ideas are foundational for 20th-century phenomenology, especially in terms of phenomenological notions of sense-impressions, the lived body, and self-consciousness. As Antoine-Mahut rightly observes, the publication of and scholarly commentary on Biran's The Relationship Between the Physical and the Moral in Man is an event in English-speaking philosophy. Readers will have for the first time access to an important work of a founding figure of spiritualist thought. The translation is careful and reads with great ease. The translators provide the original French in places where the text does not translate literally into English or in places where there may be more than one way to translate or read the text in question. The scholarly articles contextualise and show the importance of Biran's thought for philosophy today. Meacham and Spadola give to English readers an important translation of and guide to one of early modernity's more original and fascinating philosophical works.