The Relevance of Romanticism: Essays on German Romantic Philosophy

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Dalia Nassar (ed.), The Relevance of Romanticism: Essays on German Romantic Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2014, 344pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199976218.

Reviewed by Jason M. Wirth, Seattle University


Dalia Nassar's assemblage of engaging and significant essays on some of the resurgent philosophers of early German romanticism emphasizes their contemporary philosophical relevance. "For it is a specifically philosophical revival, motivated by philosophical questions" (2). Nassar demarcates this relevance into four general kinds.

In the first part of the book, consisting of a fascinating debate between two of the heaviest hitters in this revival, Manfred Frank and Frederick Beiser, the question revolves around the very identity of early German philosophical romanticism. What counts as a work of this kind? What makes these works significantly different from works by practitioners of German idealism? Or can the two areas be so clearly distinguished?

The next three sections are less global in their ambitions, but all of them touch on important facets of this period's enduring philosophical provocation. The second section features essays on the question of culture, language, sociability, and education, while the third turns to matters aesthetic, and the fourth and concluding section takes up the question of science.

After finishing the book, I could not say exactly what German romantic philosophy is, but I nonetheless had my sense of its contemporary relevance confirmed in new ways. I do not intend my remark about the ambiguity regarding the identity of German romantic philosophy to be critical. Indeed, the presentation of this ambiguity is one of the volume's assets.

The ambiguity stems in part from a current debate between Frank, who, along with Dieter Henrich, inaugurated a reappraisal and revival of this period in the German speaking world and, increasingly, beyond it, and Beiser, the justly acclaimed North American philosophical historian of this period.

Frank was the first to argue for a hard distinction between the well-known post-Kantian idealists and the lesser-known (at least philosophically) romantics. The latter are more or less those who worked together with the Schlegel brothers in Jena and their "extended family" (2) of sympathetic thinkers like Hölderlin, Goethe, and Schleiermacher. For Frank, there is a clearly discernable Denkraum or space of thought (16) that makes the romantics something like proto-speculative realists, eschewing dogmatic thought while denying any foundationalist role for the Absolute.

The Jena philosophers were in part responding to the Austrian philosopher Karl Leonhard Reinhold, the first chair of critical philosophy at Jena, and his Elementarphilosophie (Elementary Philosophy), which attempted to develop Kant more systematically by making his principle of consciousness (as well as Fichte's critical appropriation of this principle in his subjective idealism) a first principle -- "an 'I' that was boosted into something absolute" (26). (Reinhold would later yield to Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre.) For the other Jena philosophers and their geographically remote companion thinkers, the subjective absolute could not serve as a clear ground because it eluded clarity and thereby could not be contained within any domain, including the human subject. "Instead, they considered subjectivity to be a derivative phenomenon that only becomes accessible to itself under a condition or presupposition (BedingungVoraussetzung), which is beyond its (subjectivity's) control" (18).

Rather than a foundationalist approach that derives everything from the absolute subject, the romantics held to the "irrepresentability of the Absolute and redefine[d] striving after the infinite as an endless striving" (18). This liberated thinking from its obsession with the human subject as the inevitable starting point for all that is cognized, somewhat as the contemporary speculative realists try to free it from correlationism, which Quentin Meillassoux defined as "the idea according to which we only ever have access to the correlation between thinking and being, and never to either term considered apart from the other",hence "disqualifying the claim that it is possible to consider the realms of subjectivity and objectivity independently of one another."[1]

Frank, however, attempts to ground a speculative realism -- what he calls an "ontological realism" (27) -- not in an arche-fossil or hyperobject, but rather in the structure of self-consciousness itself, which in reflection discovers within itself "the notion of the essence of absolute identity as enclosing a ground that repels all consciousness" (22). This ground cannot operate as a first principle from which to derive systematically all other principles, nor can it be reduced to anything in particular, not even the absolute "I." It simultaneously prohibits all dogmatic claims: "If there is no safe foundation that presents itself to our consciousness as evident, then it is possible to doubt each of our beliefs" (23). The ground in both Reinhold and Fichte's systems therefore "loses its stabilizing function" (25). What emerges is a speculative realism that is not derived from the subject as a stabilizing ground and that renders the objects of knowledge only speculatively knowable. Beliefs, Friedrich Schlegel claimed, "are eternally valid only for the time being" (24), or, put in a more contemporary way, are necessarily contingent. This is the aspect of Kant that the romantics held onto against Reinhold and Fichte: Vorstellung or representation cannot be credited for making an object exist but only for speculatively conceiving it. Credit for the existence of what we speculatively know goes to the world itself (27; see the Critique of Pure Reason A125).

Beiser, in a witty and well-crafted response, does not disagree with Frank's characterization of or admiration for these thinkers. In his 2007 Auswege aus dem Deutchen Idealismus [Ways Out of German Idealism], a work whose very title declares the wedge that Frank wants to establish between the romantics and the idealists, however, Frank calls out Beiser for failing to appreciate this distinction. By lumping together this whole period under the moniker of idealism, as he does in both German Idealism (Harvard 2002) and The Romantic Imperative (Harvard 2003), Beiser allegedly confuses the romantics, who were "realist in their ontology" but "antifoundationalist in their epistemology" with the idealists who were foundationalists (30).

Beiser considers the disagreement in part merely "verbal" and a question of emphasis. He praises Frank for helping to demonstrate the falsity of the old reading of the romantics, which regarded them as disciples of Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre. "For them, Fichte's idealism was not the solution to be celebrated but the problem to be avoided" (32). But does Fichte exhaust the possibilities of German idealism? Frank places the romantics "outside that tradition, and indeed against it" (33). Agreeing with Frank's distinction between the romantics and Fichte's subjective idealism, Beiser nonetheless argues that equating all of idealism with Fichte is a "non sequitur" (33). There is also idealism in the "objective" sense, exemplified by both Schelling and Hegel and dramatized in Schelling's self-announced 1799 "Durchbruch zur Realität [breakthrough to reality]" (34). According to Beiser, Frank confuses the justified romantic critique of Fichte with a wholesale critique of idealism. In practice, Frank's romantic ontological realism finds parallels with Beiser's account of objective idealism, which is "an ontological thesis that holds that everything is an appearance of the ideal or intelligible; but it is not an epistemological claim that we, as finite human beings, have complete or perfect knowledge of being itself" (37).

Indeed, the paradigmatic figure for this ambiguity is Schelling himself, who broke decisively with Fichte over these kinds of issues (see Michael Vater and David W. Wood's fine translation of the Fichte-Schelling letter exchange, The Philosophical Rupture between Fichte and Schelling: Selected Texts and Correspondence (1800-1802), as well as Hegel's defense of Schelling's thinking in this regard in the so-called 1801 Differenzschrift, translated by H. S. Harris and Walter Cerf as The Difference Between Fichte's and Schelling's System of Philosophy). In the 1806 severe confrontation with Fichte, Darlegung des wahren Verhältnisses der Naturphilosophie zu der verbesserten fichteschen Lehre, Schelling attacked Fichte's inability to think the question of nature outside of the ground of subjectivity and its interests, accusing Fichte of Schwärmerei. The Schwärmer, following Luther's condemnation of those who, claiming to have seen God, fanatically and uncritically swarmed into sects and schools, know what the ground is (the foundationalism that both Frank and Beiser eschew), and, in Fichte's case, posit nature outside of the subject, as something that resists the subject, but which should be brought under the subject's control.

Schelling went on to excoriate Fichte's thinking as Bauernstolz (SW I/7, 47),[2] literally the self-congratulatory pride of a peasant who profits from nature without really grasping it. This lopsided and self-serving cultivation is at the heart of a contemporary nature annihilating Schwärmerei.

If an inflexible effort to force his subjectivity through his subjectivity as something universally valid and to exterminate all nature wherever possible and against it to make non-nature [Unnatur] a principle and to make all of the severity of a lopsided education in its dazzling isolation count as scientific truths can be called Schwärmen, then who in this whole era swarms in the authentic sense more terribly and loudly than Herr Fichte? (SW I/7, 47, translation mine)

In one of the best, most spirited, and consequential essays in the volume, Bruce Matthews cashes out the contemporary relevance of this issue, an issue that to my mind is more important than the aggregate differences between romanticism and idealism. What could be more relevant than the philosophical underpinnings of the current earth-wide ecological catastrophe?

We can see that in Schelling's critique of Descartes and Fichte's treatment of nature is the demand to extend Kant's kingdom of ends to all the kingdoms of nature. This follows clearly from his critique of the alienated subject of modernity, who values the gifts of nature only if they can be transformed into "beautiful houses and proper furniture" or "tools and household goods," since it is only then that "as a tool of his lust and desire" that the world of nature takes on meaning and value (SW 1/7, 111, 114). Cutting straight to the heart of modernity's capitalist ambitions, Schelling demands that we stop exploiting nature by making it subservient to our immediate "economic-teleological ends" as if it had no inherent value in itself (SW 1/7, 17). (211)

A less instrumental and naively positivistic (dogmatic, anti-speculative) sense of science was also at the heart of many of the philosophical activities of this period. It is critical, of course, to Schelling's Naturphilosophie, but Paul Redding is also able to explicate a complex relationship between mathematics and the poetic word in Novalis, and David W. Wood develops some of these issues in terms of Novalis' confrontation with Fichte. John H. Smith takes up mathematics in relationship to Friedrich Schlegel, and Amanda Jo Goldstein offers an illuminating account of Herder's "poetic empiricism." Finally, in another one of the volume's best essays, Nassar provides an inspiring and highly relevant argument for Goethe's contribution to contemporary environmental ethics. In contrast to the abstractions and overarching accounts that persist after the proclamation of the "end of nature," Goethe offers a refreshing alternative because "his goal was to grasp the unity in the multiplicity, and thereby recognize the distinctive singularity of each thing through its relations and place within a larger context" (310).

In addition to their much less known contributions to science and mathematics, indeed, to the very sense of what might be at stake in such activities, the romantics are much better known for their extraordinary contributions to aesthetics and the philosophy of art (as well as their own artistic productions and translations). Richard Eldridge provides a compelling reading of Hölderlin, and in another fine essay Brady Bowman defends a specifically literary value, arguing that "literature's imaginative achievement is both prior to and the fulfillment of discursive knowledge" (155). Hölderlin at his best, for example, could "evince a faith in the power of the literary imagination to reveal, transfigure, and create an authentic second nature in which the human can after all be at home" (156). Keren Gorodeisky brings Friedrich Schlegel into dialogue with Wittgenstein, and Laure Cahen-Maurel makes a thoughtful and at times exciting case for the contemporary relevance of Caspar David Friedrich's painterly relationship to the sublime.

The crises of contemporary culture include not only the unfolding ecological disaster and the legitimacy crises of the art world. They also include the role of the university, sociability, and culture as such. These were also big themes for the romantic philosophers, and Karl Ameriks offers a defense of a romantic account of historical succession, Michael N. Forster excavates a romantic breed of linguistic analysis, Kristin Gjesdal brings Schleiermacher into productive relationship with Hegel, and Jane Kneller articulates a romantic account of sociability.

In the end, I would have been curious to see Frank's response to Beiser, but I also agree with Beiser that the distinction between romanticism and idealism may to some extent be "a purely verbal" question (31). Perhaps this issue could be avoided altogether by insisting on a more neutral and less final position-oriented designation that preserves the many productive tensions within this period. Perhaps we could think of these thinkers as part of the post-Kantian climate of ideas. Clearly this book enriches our appreciation of all of the thinkers in both putative camps. However one thinks it, in the end this book makes it abundantly clear that this period is one of Western philosophy's golden ages and that in some ways contemporary philosophical discourse is still catching up with it.

[1] Quentin Meillassoux, After Finitude: An Essay on the Necessity of Contingency, trans. Ray Brassier (London: Continuum, 2008), 5.

[2] Citations follow the standard pagination, which adheres to the original edition established after Schelling’s death by his son, Karl. It lists the division, followed by the volume, followed by the page number. Hence, (I/1, 1) would read, division one, volume one, page one. This pagination is preserved in Manfred Schröter’s critical reorganization of this material: Schellings Sämtliche Werke, ed. K. F. A. Schelling (Stuttgart-Augsburg: J. G. Cotta 1856-1861); Schellings Werke: Nach der Originalausgabe in neuer Anordnung, ed. Manfred Schröter (Munich: C. H. Beck, 1927). SW (=Sämtliche Werke) is also employed by some of the authors in this volume, including Bruce Matthews.