The Republic of the Living: Biopolitics and the Critique of Civil Society

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Miguel Vatter, The Republic of the Living: Biopolitics and the Critique of Civil Society, Fordham University Press, 2014, 403pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823256020.

Reviewed by Nathan Widder, Royal Holloway, University of London


The aim of this highly complex and engaging study is to demonstrate the connection between an affirmative biopolitics and a republican political spirit. Taking up recent Italian theory's formulation of Michel Foucault's biopower as containing negative and affirmative conceptions of power, Miguel Vatter holds that the affirmative form must be linked to a republican and communist (or "commune-ist") politics that offers both a critique of and an alternative to neoliberalism's negative biopolitics. In this way, he challenges a rather different notion of affirmative biopolitics that

think[s] that the connection between law and life must be antinomical, as if the nondomination of life (and therefore affirmative biopolitics) must entail the exclusion of law and, conversely, the rule of law must entail a 'state of exception' over life that leads to a politics of death. (4)

Hence the connection Vatter draws to "the modern tradition of revolutionary republicanism" (4), understanding republicanism "as the rule of law based on the power of the people that brings to an end the government of human beings over each other" (5). A "surplus of life" over any (negatively) biopolitical disciplining and control of life is at the foundation of this republican politics. Elaborating it takes Vatter through readings of Hegel, Marx, Arendt, Benjamin, and Foucault, with further engagements with Heidegger, Agamben, Kierkegaard, Hayek, Spinoza, Lukács, and more.

The key terms organizing Vatter's account are natality, normality, and normativity. Natality refers to the biological side of human life and is designated by the Greek zoe. On the one hand, it is linked to sexuality and family life, the living force of labour, and Agamben's "bare life", all of which are subjected to biopolitical discipline while being excluded from the political sphere; but on the other hand, it is associated with a constituent human power of creativity that founds affirmative biopolitics. Normality, associated with the Greek bios, refers to the form of life governed by norms (nomos), which is common to both the negative biopolitics of normalization and the affirmative biopolitics of republican collective self-governance. Normativity, involving the singular unity of universal and particular, connotes the creative aspect of collective life, and partakes in a kind of eternal life. The negative biopolitics of neoliberalism separates bios and zoe, and humanist attempts to resist it maintain this separation by holding human freedom to come by way of transcending our animality, similarly conceiving revolution in terms of a future that transcends the present. Affirmative biopolitics, in contrast, politicizes zoe by raising its foundational power to a collective force of political creation, and understands revolution not as an act of transcendence from the world but as a re-immersion in it, a re-immersion that Vatter associates with Benjamin's messianic Marxism and Nietzsche's doctrine of eternal recurrence. While negative biopolitics establishes the institutions of governmentality by collapsing law into order, normativity into normality, thereby hijacking the republican ideas of law and nomos, affirmative biopolitics restores the republican constitutional idea of rule of law by returning to a substantive normative order.

The biopolitical analysis is organized across four domains: political economy and civil society; family life and sexuality; the notion of rights; and considerations of eternal life and revolution. The first of these is addressed primarily through Hegel and Marx. Against those who read Hegel as a liberal authoritarian who defends the free market and individual civil rights (21), Vatter argues that Hegel presents a republican critique of modern civil society. Focussing on the accounts of Greek tragedy in an early text, Natural Law, and the Phenomenology of Spirit, he maintains that politics for Hegel emerges from a compromise between civil society and the state involving a reciprocal sacrifice. Civil society sacrifices its tribal institutions of sacrifice and revenge so that the state can govern it by imposing a collective power to judge and punish the crimes generated by civil society's pursuits of individual interests, which when unchecked in civil society culminate in war (30-31). The state, in turn, sacrifices part of its republican ideal of political equality to allow the existence of a bourgeois civil society that proliferates inequalities (34-35). This compromise takes place through a profanation carried out in civil society that reduces all that is sacred to money values, though profanation, in turn, becomes a way also to restore republican values. The early Hegel also contributes to an affirmative biopolitics with the Dialectic of Lordship and Bondage, which sees freedom and self-consciousness emerging not by a separation from the biological but instead through a raising up or spiritualization of zoe. Marx, for his part, continues the development of these Hegelian biopolitical themes in his account of value (62). On the one hand, politics and production remain tied to biological life understood as human species being and animality -- "for Marx human production is a generalization of the animal's creativity, not its overcoming" (66) -- while, on the other hand, Marx locates the source of value in time understood as an intensive and qualitative force, a power of life that capitalism denudes by converting it into an extensive and quantitative form of abstract labour time (81, 82).

The biopolitics of the family is analysed primarily through Agamben, Benjamin, Arendt, and Foucault. The central task of these chapters is to reverse the priority given to bios over zoe, to individual (disciplined) life over collective biological life. This reversal is carried out in part by a continuation of the theme of profanation, here applied to the reified and fetishized commodities generated by capitalism, but in a way that, pace Agamben, turns them over to free and common use, and that, pace Benjamin, involves a nihilistic "going under" that redeems the present by transmuting the past, a profanation that avoids restoring a religious ideal of the future. Arendt's conception of natality grounds human freedom and plurality in biology and worldliness, allowing her to counter both the totalitarian denigration of plurality and humanist and neo-Aristotelian accounts that separate bios and zoe. Finally, through Benjamin, the idea of eternal life is advanced not by way of an aestheticization of bios that would make the individual heroic and beautiful but by redeeming sexuality and zoe from guilt. This goal is further developed by Foucault, who aestheticizes zoe in the form of a new art of sexual practice and politicizes this art by associating it with "relational rights" (189-190).

The chapters concerned with the biopolitics of right analyse Hayek's neoliberal appropriation of the republican idea of rights, which works by collapsing law and order, and holds that Foucault adopts a republican position that insists on law and order's irreducibility. They also further explore Arendt's natality in the context of her assertion of the right to have rights, with Vatter arguing that this right cannot be the consequence of presupposed political spaces and institutions but must instead be a natural and collective constituent power to create these, a power grounded in human zoe. Arendt's use of the term "constitution" thus retains a dual meaning, as a moment of political closure and settlement on the one hand, and as an openness to an extrapolitical "new law" that maintains the connection between human freedom and revolutionary change (244) on the other hand. In this way, republican politics is also a cosmopolitanism.

Finally, the chapters on the biopolitics of eternal life explore whether there is something irreducibly affirmative about this constituent life power that precludes its being placed in the service of dominating life, and maintains that this affirmative dimension is rightly considered eternal. Vatter associates this life power with Spinoza's "conatus", which makes each thing infinite through its connection to an immanent God, and also links it to French phenomenological and deconstructive approaches to Heidegger's analytic of finitude, arguing that these show how Dasein's being-toward-death, despite attempting to separate Dasein from an animal life of drives that remain distinct from its temporalization of temporality, takes it towards a knowledge of eternal life. He further associates eternal life with a notion of virtuality elaborated by way of Agamben and Deleuze. Finally, returning to Benjamin's messianism, Vatter associates eternal life on the one hand with the revolutionary present that breaks with history, and on the other hand with Nietzsche's eternal return as a doctrine that redeems natality, creation, and an overcoming that comes about by way of a nihilistic going under.

Vatter's argument that a revived republican politics can offer an affirmative biopolitical response to neoliberalism is compelling in many respects. But in his commitment to it he seems to overlook some of its difficulties and to overreach in some of his readings. I will discuss what I see as two cases of this, one regarding Hegel and the other regarding Foucault. With respect to Hegel, Vatter develops an engaging critique of civil society through his focus on Hegel's early texts, but seems to ignore how its positioning of crime, tragedy, justice, and war stands in sharp contrast to Hegel's later account in, say, the Philosophy of Right. In that text, Hegel considers vengeance to be a product not of civil society but abstract right, holds that civil society's court and police institutions offer the first form of genuine justice by uniting the individual and universal through the institution of positive law, and treats war as the result not of civil society or the need to defend bourgeois interests but rather of the state's need occasionally to reinforce the unity it supposedly realizes for its people. It may be the case that in Natural Law and the Phenomenology "Hegel's use of Greek tragedy to advance his critique of civil society depends on the presupposition that modern civil 'society' is still characterized by a tribal or 'natural' form of ethical life" (28). But matters are very different in the Philosophy of Right, where Hegel maintains that tragedy disappears with the emergence of modern ethical life, and where he provides a very different critique of civil society and its inequalities. If indeed "Hegel never stops being a republican political thinker" (21), the republicanism of his later thought is markedly different, but as a consequence it might also reveal a different set of issues with which republican thought must contend. It is not without reason that Hegel is frequently seen as a preeminent philosopher of the modern disciplinary state (by Deleuze, for example). While republican theorists need not endorse the direction Hegel's thought eventually takes, it seems odd that this direction and the difficulties it suggests are not at least acknowledged.

This last point leads me to Foucault, and specifically to his "Politics and Ethics: An Interview" of April, 1983, where he is questioned about Arendt's concept of affirmative and collective power. Foucault replies that this notion of power can serve as a critical principle (but not, he adds, as a regulatory ideal), but he nevertheless maintains that he does "not believe that that liquidates the problem of the power relation."[1] Vatter himself never addresses this issue, and instead seemingly tries to displace it by consistently asserting that Foucault himself adopts a republican stance. He maintains, for example, that because Foucault "rejects all attempts at reconciling law with order," this indicates that he advocates "for the autonomy of law with respect to the (sovereign) state, a position that is often associated with republican . . . constitutionalism" (201). He also contends that Foucault's understanding of a political power that is distinct from pastoral and sovereign forms of power "no doubt" (207) has republican origins, and that when Foucault speaks of self-mastery in relation to the care of the self, "he is clearly referring to the republican tradition" (209). But it is not at all clear that whatever affinities Foucault's antagonism to liberal individualism and his use of the language of rights and freedom may have with republican thought negates his explicit eschewals of his thought being political in this way.[2] Moreover, Foucault's understanding of power as a multiplicity of constitutive micropower relations in tension and flux cuts against Vatter's notion of constituent political power in at least two significant ways. First, being "both intentional and nonsubjective,"[3] Foucault's power relations are incompatible with the idea of "the politically active subject" (141) of Vatter's affirmative biopolitics. Second, the mutual imbrication of power and resistance in these relations, as well as their immanence to the macropower formations they constitute, means that there is nothing in their nature that necessitates one political form rather than another, so that inasmuch as human agents are wrapped up in and contribute to these relations, they participate in the constitution of sovereign or disciplinary forms of power in the same way as they do for a republican or any other form that could resist these.

These points aside, Vatter offers a powerful and provocative contribution to debates about the nature of biopolitics. His book offers a suggestive way to carry forward Foucault's thought and to link it to broader theoretical trends, giving readers much to ponder about the relation between life, power, and future political possibilities.

[1] "Politics and Ethics: An Interview" in Paul Rabinow (ed.), The Foucault Reader, New York, Pantheon Books, 1984, 373-380, 378.

[2] For example: "if it [my thought] were political it would inevitably be localized in the political arena. In fact, I have especially wanted to question politics, and to bring to light in the political field . . . some problems that had not been recognized before. I mean that the questions I am trying to ask are not determined by a pre-established political outlook and do not tend toward the realization of some definite political project" ("Politics and Ethics," op. cit., 375).

[3] Michel Foucault, The History of Sexuality, Volume One: An Introduction, trans. Robert Hurley, New York, Vintage Books, 1990, 94.