The Retreat of Reason: A Dilemma in the Philosophy of Life

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Ingmar Persson, The Retreat of Reason: A Dilemma in the Philosophy of Life, Oxford University Press, 2005, 494pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199276900.

Reviewed by Jonas Olson, Brasenose College, University of Oxford


This book has been long in the making and it is no exaggeration to say that it was worth the wait. The dramatis personae in Ingmar Persson's hugely impressive work are the rationalists and the satisfactionalists. The controversy between the two camps concerns one of the profoundest questions in philosophy, viz. the question of how one ought to live. Rationalists hold that human lives should be permeated by a pursuit of philosophical truth and that life should be led in accordance with such truth. Satisfactionalists hold that life should be led in ways that make them as fulfilling as possible, in terms of pleasure and felt satisfaction. (It should be noted that this is not to say that satisfactionalists must be crude hedonists; for a satisfactionalist, it is permissible for one to prefer some things -- e.g., that peace finally settles in the Middle East -- more than one prefers maximising one's own satisfaction. Persson calls such preferences ideals.)

In contrast to a philosophical opinion common in ancient Greece, Persson believes that the most rational life, i.e. the life led in the light of philosophical truth, and the most fulfilling life, i.e. the life rich in satisfaction, are not coincidental. In fact, they are practically incompatible. Attempting to lead rational lives forces us to give up on a number of attitudes and convictions that are deeply ingrained in the nature of human agents and without which our lives will be considerably less fulfilling from the satisfactionalist perspective. For those who endeavour to lead their lives in the light of reason it is rational to strive to overcome such attitudes and convictions. A person successful in the rationalist endeavour will thus have entered a solemn sphere where reason is the sole ruler, a retreat of reason. Conversely, for those who endeavour to lead lives that are as fulfilling as possible it is rational to cling to those deeply engrained attitudes and convictions, which from the rationalist perspective must be deemed unsustainable. A person successful in the satisfactionalist endeavour will thus in many cases let reason go on holiday; she will see reason as in many cases retreating from playing the role of the guiding principle of how to live. These are the two meanings of the book's title. And such is the dilemma in the philosophy of life, which constitutes the book's leitmotif.

As I have already indicated, The Retreat of Reason is a hugely impressive work. Since space obviously does not allow me to do full justice to its complexity and sophistication I shall attempt a brief summary of the structure of the book, and then make a few more detailed comments. The book has five parts. Parts I and II set the stage. Part I analyzes pain, pleasure, and the concepts of desire and emotion. Among the views Persson defends here are sensory quality views of pleasure and pain, according to which pleasantness and painfulness are sensory qualities that supervene on other intrinsic qualities of sensations of pleasure and pain. These supervenient sensory qualities are the qualities on account of which subjects like sensations of pleasure and dislike sensations of pain. Part I also refutes hedonism (there are other things than pleasure and pain that we desire and dislike for their own sakes) and provides a typology of emotions.

Part II gives the metaethical framework of the book. Persson defends subjectivism -- or desire-relativity -- of value, and internalism about reasons. These views are less fashionable nowadays than they once were and Persson does a good job in trying to restore some of their credibility. I will return to some of his arguments below. On a critical note, it is not wholly clear that the detailed discussions in parts I and II are of crucial relevance to the dilemma unwrapped in parts III-V. For instance, Persson points out that even if his subjectivist and desire-relative metaethics were flawed, this would not undermine the significance of the dilemma. Objectivists about value and externalists about reasons are likely to hold that the rational life and the fulfilling life are both valuable forms of life, and consequently that there are reasons to aim both for rationality and satisfaction. The positive side of the coin is that readers mainly interested in some particular topic discussed in the book can, with considerable pay-off, focus exclusively on just one of the largely self-contained parts.

So which are the attitudes and convictions that rationalists will strive to get rid of, and satisfactionalists will cling to? They are our temporal and personal biases, and our beliefs in responsibility and desert. Part III argues that we spontaneously tend to discount the importance of past events and events in the distant future; we are biased towards what we perceive at present and we are biased towards the future, in particular the near future. We often prefer to have pains and hardships over and done with and pleasant sensations ahead of us, and we often choose to forego a greater pleasure occurring in the distant future in favour of a lesser pleasure occurring in the near future. Persson argues that from the rationalist perspective such temporal partiality is intolerable since "being cognitively rational requires representing all relevant information equally vividly" (216). Part of the explanation of why we sometimes forego greater pleasures in the distant future in favour of lesser pleasures in the near future is that when we await the greater pleasure we experience the discomfort of having a desire (for a certain pleasant experience) unfulfilled, and this will serve to undermine the vividness of the representation of the future greater pleasure. Hence, our bias towards what we perceive at the present moment is at the root of our bias towards the future. So rationalists will strive to get rid of our temporal biases. By contrast, satisfactionalists will cling to them both since our biases towards the future have "the beneficial effect of keeping us alert to the future" (218) and also since, given the nature of human agents, getting rid of these biases would be so difficult as to make the cost higher than the gain. More specifically, the rational demand for temporal neutrality will force rationalists to adopt a perspective sub specie aeternitatis. But to view one's life from this perspective is likely to evoke senses of futility and transience. Indeed, from the point of view of eternity, writing a book, say, seems extremely futile (not to mention writing a book review). The same goes for the vast majority of life projects that satisfactionalists see as making life worth living. Satisfactionalists therefore recommend against dispensing with our temporal biases.

Part IV discusses another bias, the bias towards oneself. This is the longest and densest part of the book. Persson argues against immaterialist theories of the self, as well as against psychological and somatist theories of personal identity. One startling conclusion reached is factual nihilism about our identity. This is the view that we are not identical to things of any kind. Persson denies that this view has the absurd implication that we do not exist, for tokens of 'I' still correctly identify us as subjects with experiences. But these subjects are identical neither to something essentially somatic, nor to something essentially mental. In short, "what is identified [by uses of 'I'] does not belong to any kind with its own conditions of identity" (297). Since factual nihilism about our identity is true, rationalists demand complete personal neutrality, whereas satisfactionalists maintain that the costs of abandoning personal partiality are too high.

Part V deals with freedom of the will, responsibility, and desert. Persson's first move is to mount a familiar compatibilist defence of the practice of blaming and praising people for their actions; this practice can be justified on forward-looking grounds since it has beneficial consequences for the agent and her surroundings. But to say that blaming and praising is just, is to invoke the notion of desert. Desert is a backward-looking notion that presupposes ultimate responsibility. To say that an agent, A, is responsible for some action, a, is to say that A has a 'responsibility-giving feature', F, in virtue of which A is responsible for a. But in order for A to be ultimately responsible for a, A must be responsible for having whatever properties that caused her to have F, and so on. This regress cannot go on forever, which is to say that the notion of ultimate responsibility, and along with it the notion of desert, is rationally indefensible. As Persson notes, his argument here is reminiscent of arguments put forward by Henry Sidgwick, Thomas Nagel, and Galen Strawson.

I shall now like to make some more detailed comments on some of Persson's many arguments. First, I want to dispute something Persson says when discussing truth-entailing and non-truth-entailing emotions. Persson claims that, e.g., hope is of the latter kind (that 'A hopes that p' is true does not entail that p is true), and that, e.g., gladness is of the former kind (that 'A is glad that p' is true entails that p is true). Moreover, Persson claims that if 'A is glad that p' is true, it follows that A knows that p. Persson does not mean to say that there is gladness only if there is knowledge, but that A's gladness is properly expressed as 'A is glad that p' only if A knows that p. "Somebody who is of the opinion that not-p would have to say something like 'A is glad because he is convinced that p'" (80). I doubt this. Suppose that I am glad that I have submitted a book review in due time. Suppose also that I have mixed up dates so that my belief is in fact false. To say that I am glad because I am convinced that I have submitted the review in due time is to misrepresent this aspect of my mental life, it is to misrepresent how things seem to me from my first-person perspective: I am not glad that I am in a certain mental state (of being convinced that I have submitted the review in due time). Somebody occupying a third-person perspective could truly say that what causes my gladness is my being convinced that I have submitted the review on time. But again, this is not -- from my first-person perspective -- what I am glad about. This suggests that emotions like gladness, sadness, and the like, are not truth-entailing.

Let me now move on to one of Persson's points about the structure of reasons, which I take to be true and important. It is common practice to distinguish between normative and motivating (or justifying and explanatory) reasons. But Persson makes a tripartite distinction between real reasons, apparent reasons, and explanatory reasons. Real reasons are truths about what counts for or against doing, believing, or desiring something. Apparent reasons are the reasons we take there to be, i.e. the propositional contents of our beliefs about reasons. Such beliefs may or may not be true, of course, so apparent reasons may or may not correspond to real reasons. Reasons in the explanatory sense are psychological states, or as Persson says, facts about agents' psychological states; it is facts about agents' psychological states that (from a third-person perspective) causally explain agents' actions. This is an important point since it shows that the debate on whether reasons for actions and attitudes are causes is a chimera. Reasons are not causes if we are talking about real and apparent reasons; reasons are causes if we are talking about explanatory reasons. I would like to make one amendment to Persson's account on this score. Persson claims that "… when we make a real reason our reason, the very same thing becomes our reason" (121 [Persson's italics]). Since Persson believes that apparent reasons are propositions, he must also believe that real reasons are (true) propositions. But it strikes me as more plausible to say that real reasons are facts about how things are in the world rather than abstract objects like propositions. Persson might have a theory of facts and propositions according to which the two come down to the same thing, metaphysically speaking. But he has not told us what that theory is.

As noted above, Persson defends Williams-style internalism about reasons, according to which reasons are necessarily dependent on desires. Here is an attempt to summarise his chief argument for this position: Suppose that I have an apparent reason to bring about p and that I take this reason to outweigh any competing reasons. Then, since internalism construes my reasons as definitionally tied to my desires, there is on internalism no logical space for me to ask 'Why (shall I) bring about p?', where 'shall' is not used in what Persson calls the 'rationally normative' sense, but in the 'expressive(ly normative)' sense in which it expresses a decision. Now, Persson goes on to say that

On externalism, there could, however, be room to ask 'Why (shall I) bring about p?' in the expressive(ly normative) sense implying that I am undecided, for [externalism] does not make it logically necessary that my having apparent reasons makes me motivated. This would then have to be a request for something other than externalist reasons, something that could motivate one to make a decision. But what could possibly fill this gap? (122)

But here it seems to me that Persson equivocates between internalism contra externalism about reasons and internalism contra externalism about motivation. Externalism about reasons denies that agents' reasons are necessarily dependent on agents' desires. This position is equally compatible with internalism and externalism about motivation. Externalists about reasons may well agree with internalists about motivation that any agent who sincerely accepts that she has decisive reasons to bring about p must be motivated to bring about p; there is no logical space for such an agent to ask 'Why (shall I) bring about p?'. Since internalism contra externalism about reasons and internalism contra externalism about motivation are logically independent, Persson's argument for internalism about reasons collapses.

In scope and ambition, The Retreat of Reason is comparable to modern classics such as Derek Parfit's Reasons and Persons and Nagel's The View from Nowhere. (Parfit frequently crops up as an ally as well as a target of criticism throughout parts II-IV.) More importantly still, The Retreat of Reason matches these seminal works in terms of philosophical sophistication and rigour of argument. It is an enlightening as well as a fulfilling read. Consequently, both rationalists and satisfactionalists should engage with it.