The Retrieval of Ethics

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Talbot Brewer, The Retrieval of Ethics, Oxford UP, 2009, 344pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199557882.

Reviewed by Tamar Schapiro, Stanford University



Talbot Brewer’s The Retrieval of Ethics is a deep, provocative, and wide-ranging contribution to the virtue ethical critique of modern moral philosophy. Brewer reads the history of moral philosophy from Plato and Aristotle to the present as a devolution, and his aim is to “retrieve” the insights of the Ancients in such a way as to bring out their inherently radical potential. In so doing, he hopes to resist what he sees as the current tendency to “normalize” virtue ethics, a tendency to see it as theory number three on a menu that includes Kantianism and Utilitarianism. Instead he hopes to build on the works of Anscombe, MacIntyre, and Murdoch, reviving their sense of despair and distress at what they saw as the fundamental disorientation both of modern moral philosophy and of the wider culture.

The argument is laid out in eight chapters, through which we come to see progressively both the target of Brewer’s critique and the contours of his positive view. Brewer first criticizes what he calls the “world-making conception of agency”, a production-oriented conception of both action and desire. In contrast to this world-making conception, he draws on neo-Platonic Christian theology to develop a truly original account of what he calls “dialectical activity” and its associated notion of desire. I will have more to say about this part of the argument below. Once the notion of dialectical activity is on the table, Brewer takes on further elements of his target view, arguing in turn that each must be reconceptualized if it is to account for dialectical activity. Some of the theses Brewer opposes along the way are familiar targets of earlier virtue theoretic critiques: the conception of action as production, the notion of pleasure as a sensation that follows upon an activity as an effect follows a cause, the thought of the personal good as something distinct from and opposed to the impersonal good, and the view that ethics trades in thin rather than thick concepts. But some of Brewer’s targets are new, for example the very basic thesis that the role of practical thinking, and of moral theory generally, is to take us from a description of our circumstances to a conclusion about what we ought to do. Brewer calls even this assumption into question, arguing that the role of practical thinking is, rather, to “grasp what one is already doing in such a way as to lift it, moment by moment, closer to the ideal form in whose light it is understood” (87). The implications of this alternative view of practical thinking for moral philosophy would no doubt be radical. But Brewer is not afraid to go out on a limb when led there by the logic of his argument, carving out new conceptual space in the process. This is what makes the book refreshing.

Because of its central role in the argument, I want to focus on the notion of “dialectical activity”, which Brewer introduces in the second chapter of the book. Dialectical activity is something like activity that is valued for its own sake, but whereas all dialectical activity is valued for its own sake, Brewer leaves it open whether all activity that is valued for its own sake is dialectical (39). What is distinctive of dialectical activity is not simply that it is valued for its own sake, but that our engagement in it has a certain structure. An agent engaged in dialectical activity is engaged in “an activity whose value cannot be grasped with perfect lucidity from the outset, but must be progressively clarified via engagement in the activity itself” (39). Dialectical activities have what Brewer calls a “self-unveiling character, in the sense that each successive engagement yields a further stretch of understanding of the goods internal to the activity, hence of what would count as a proper engagement in it” (37). We are drawn into such activities on the basis of a somewhat opaque “intimation” of the goods intrinsic to them (136). As we engage further, that intimation of goodness becomes more lucid and articulable, yielding a deeper understanding of what we are already doing. This understanding in turn allows us to do what we are already doing better, in a way that more fully realizes the activity’s intrinsic goods.

Brewer’s historical reference point in developing his notion of dialectical activity is a particular tradition of neo-Platonic Christian thought, one to which St. Augustine and the mystical theologian Gregory of Nyssa were contributors. The dialectical structure is evident in their characterizations of the longing for God, a longing for a kind of vision or understanding, the object of which would always outstrip our capacity to see and comprehend it. Brewer tries to show, independently of any theological assumptions, that activities manifesting this dialectical structure are pervasive in human life, and indeed that among them are the activities that we typically find most fulfilling and meaningful. His primary examples of dialectical activities are friendships and other love relationships, conversation, philosophical and other sorts of free inquiry, and the creation and appreciation of art. He writes:

To love another is to be drawn to another by a generous straining to bring into focus the goodness, hence desirability, of an as-yet-obscure object of desire. The lover stands ready to interpret the beloved’s words and actions as signposts towards further discoveries about what it is good to be or to do, and this interpretive posture sustains and is sustained by attention-riveting appreciation of the other. At its best, this is a mutual and continuously reiterated process. It involves a readiness on the part of each to be guided by the example of the other in articulating an evolving understanding of the human good. (64)

The same dialectical structure, he claims, is evident in certain activities undertaken for their own sakes, like philosophizing. We are drawn to philosophy by an inchoate appreciation of the constitutive standards and ideals of the activity. Given favorable conditions, “our first and still halting attempts to philosophize can begin to open our eyes to the goods realizable in philosophy, bringing into progressively clearer focus the initially obscure object of whatever desire might have induced us to give it a try” (39).

Brewer’s most basic claim is that once we appreciate the structure and pervasiveness of dialectical activities, we will find reason to reject the philosophical conception of agency presupposed by modern moral theories across the spectrum. That “world-making conception of agency” consists in the thesis that “all actions borrow their intelligibility as actions, and the meaning or point in the eyes of their agents, from the states of affairs that they are calculated to bring about” (12). According to Brewer, it is not only consequentialists who hold to this view. Although non-consequentialists typically deny that actions necessarily gain their meaning or value from what they bring about, Brewer maintains that they nevertheless buy into the world-making conception of agency. “Actions that are chosen for their own sake,” he writes, “are not viewed as exceptions but as limiting cases: they are motivated by the desire or intention to bring it about that they occur” (12).

An initial problem with this characterization is that non-consequentialists have explicitly tried to reject the view that to perform an action valued for its own sake is simply to bring it about that a valuable event happens. Canonical discussions of the “paradox of deontology” warn against thinking of non-consequentialism this way, lest it collapse into a “utilitarianism of rights”. Nagel in particular stresses both the necessity and the difficulty of characterizing the value of doings in a way that makes it irreducible to the value of happenings. Brewer does not engage these discussions explicitly, and to this extent his non-consequentialist readers will not readily recognize themselves in his depiction of them. That said, the fact that non-consequentialists feel the need to distance themselves from the world-making conception does not mean they have succeeded in defining an alternative.

A related element of Brewer’s target is a conception of desire that he claims supports and is supported by the world-making conception of agency. This he calls the “propositionalist” conception of desire, consisting in three “dogmas of desire”. The dogmas are: 1) that desires are propositional attitudes, i.e., desires “that such-and-such occur”, 2) that one has the relevant attitude towards a proposition when one is disposed to act on the world in ways calculated to make the proposition true, and 3) that beliefs and desire can be paired to yield a rationalizing explanation of any action (16-17). While I agree with Brewer that this picture of desire is prevalent, and that it does reinforce the world-making conception of agency, it is a stretch to claim, as Brewer apparently does, that all contemporary moral philosophers share in this view. Kantians, most notably, reject the belief-desire picture on the grounds that it conflates desire and volition and fails to make room for choice. Kantians hold, moreover, that maxims are essential to motivation, and while Brewer does make a few critical remarks about this assumption, it is clearly part of a different picture than the propositionalist one, towards which he focuses his main argument.

But even if the world-making conception of agency and the propositionalist conception of desire aren’t as thoroughly pervasive as Brewer suggests, it would be interesting if attention to the dialectical structure of intrinsically valuable activities allowed us to appreciate an entirely different way of conceiving of human action and the desires that motivate it. How do dialectical activities pose a challenge to the familiar world-making picture?

Brewer starts from an argument against propositionalism that is not entirely new. The claim is simply that if desires are to explain action, they have to make reference not simply to the agent’s dispositions, but to the agent’s evaluative conception of the world. To have a desire is not simply to be induced to bring something about, but to be guided by a conception of an object as good. This argument is familiar from Warren Quinn’s article, “Putting Rationality in its Place”, and it has been reiterated by Dennis Stampe and T.M. Scanlon, whom Brewer cites approvingly. Brewer calls this alternative the “evaluative outlook” conception of desire. But the evaluative outlook conception of desire, as articulated by Brewer’s predecessors, had nothing to do with dialectical activity. Brewer implicitly radicalizes the evaluative outlook conception of desire in the following way. In dialectical activity, the agent is evaluatively focused on an object that he represents not only as good, but as good in an ideal sense — as setting a kind of standard that allows for infinite approximation, infinite perfectibility. Brewer never states that he is radicalizing the evaluative outlook picture in this way, but he nevertheless relies on this revision in giving his account of the desires that draw us into dialectical activity. The idea that we see the good of the object of our desire as an ideal is not part of Quinn, Stampe, or Scanlon’s conception of desire.

Brewer is explicit about radicalizing the evaluative outlook conception of desire in a further way. On both the propositionalist and the evaluative outlook conceptions of desire, desire is regarded as an attitude that has a world-to-mind direction of fit. Brewer suggests that we have to revise this idea once we take dialectical activity as a kind of paradigm (44). If desiring an object is like loving a person, then the object of our desire is something we strive to understand and appreciate, not something we aim to bring about. Similarly, Brewer wants to argue, when we love philosophy itself for its own sake, the object of our desire is the activity itself, something we strive to understand and appreciate, but not something we aim to bring about. He writes:

In the standard case … the desire to philosophize is not a desire that (it be the case that) one philosophizes. It is, rather, the state we are in when we feel the appeal, the tug, of philosophy’s constitutive ideals. It is hard to shake the sense that this must make it a “world-making” desire after all — i.e. that it is a functional state that inclines one to work on the world so as to make it true that we approximate these ideals in our activities. But this would be yet again to mistake the desire’s proper expression for its object. Desires to engage in dialectical activities are quite literally desires for those activities, conceived in light of their constitutive ideals and internal goods. We are drawn to such things as reading or conversing or philosophizing when we have a vivid sense of the appeal of the goods internal to these activities. This way of seeing these activities does typically induce us to bring about the state of affairs in which we are reading or conversing or philosophizing, but it is not reducible to a disposition to bring about these or any other states of affairs. The object of such a desire is that towards which it draws our evaluative focus, not the state of the world that we are inclined to bring about when our evaluative attention is focused in this way. (46)

Here I take Brewer to be saying that in dialectical activity, we often express our appreciation of the goodness of the activity itself by making a difference in the world, but making that difference isn’t something we aim at simply in virtue of having the desire. This makes it look as though desire has a mind-to-world direction of fit, and that it has this direction of fit exclusively. It does not also have a world-to-mind direction of fit. Brewer does not say this explicitly, so I am not sure whether it is his considered position. But the passage above does suggest that when I act out of my love for philosophy — say, by engaging in a philosophical conversation — I may be realizing the ideal that I love, but I am not thereby fulfilling my desire. My desire is not a demand or a proposal or an invitation to do anything, and so what I do cannot count as fulfilling or satisfying or acting on it. At most, my action counts as the expression of my desire, as laughing counts as an expression of joy.

Brewer does not give his rival conception of desire a name other than the “evaluative outlook” conception, but as I have mentioned, his view is much more radical than standard versions of that conception. If I were to name it, I would call it a conception of “desire as love”, where love is understood on the model of ideal interpersonal love. If this conception is indeed intended to play the roles that desire is normally thought to play in a theory of agency, then it really does constitute a new and interesting contribution to contemporary debates.

The question I have is whether, in purifying his view of even the slightest trace of the world-making conception of agency, Brewer has rejected agency as such. One way to put my worry might be this: Brewer rejects the propositionalist’s claim that desires are “desires that” such-and-such be the case in favor of the view that they are “desires for” a beloved object, whether it be an agent or an activity. But the notion of desire we need for a theory of agency is “desire to”. If, by “desires for”, Brewer means desires that can only be expressed by, but cannot be fulfilled by, actions that produce changes in states of affairs, then what sense can we give to the fundamental idea of having and fulfilling a “desire to x”? Suppose that, in virtue of my love of philosophy, I have a desire to write a paper on a certain topic. Presumably I can fulfill that desire by writing the paper. In that sense, actually writing the paper is the object of my desire. My desire is a desire to write the paper, and I fulfill it by writing the paper. I don’t think this need imply that the object of my desire is a state of affairs, rather than my ideal of philosophical activity. In adopting and working towards my goal of writing the paper, I am valuing it as one limited way of realizing my ideal. Love for an ideal typically generates desires to do the things that one sees as realizing those ideals. Having those desires involves setting ends, the realization of which determines the standard by which we judge whether those desires have been fulfilled. Brewer’s account of desire makes it hard to see how desiring can involve the setting of ends, which in turn makes it hard to see how desires can be fulfilled or thwarted. So while the account does seem to capture characteristic features of loving an ideal, I find it less plausible as an account of the desires that spring from that love.

Here I have addressed only one strand of the argument of an enormously rich book that draws fruitfully upon philosophical, literary, and theological works and covers an incredibly broad swath of philosophical terrain. Notably, I have ignored Brewer’s detailed interpretations of Aristotle’s notions of pleasure, friendship, and contemplation, and his provocative discussion of the aim of theoretical reason (which he claims is “understanding” rather than “true belief”). The book is quite long, and the writing ranges from truly poetic to slightly overwrought, but readers who are unable to work through the whole argument can for the most part benefit from reading chapters in isolation. Each has drama, depth, and insight. In sum, The Retrieval of Ethics is a challenging and rewarding contribution not only to the narrow field called “virtue ethics”, but to practical philosophy very broadly construed.