The Riddle of Hume's Treatise: Skepticism, Naturalism, and Irreligion

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Paul Russell, The Riddle of Hume's Treatise: Skepticism, Naturalism, and Irreligion, Oxford University Press, 2008, 424pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195110333.

Reviewed by Rico Vitz, University of North Florida


Are Hume's skeptical principles reconcilable with his naturalistic 'science of man'? This is the 'riddle' of Hume's Treatise. Without a solution to this riddle (specifically, one that offers an affirmative answer to the question), Hume's project seems self-defeating, with his skeptical principles undermining his attempt to develop the new 'science' (pp. 3, 270ff; cf. p. vii). Thus, the riddle has understandably been both a major point of contention among Hume scholars as well as a source of intriguing and helpful discussions for philosophers interested in Hume's work. Paul Russell attempts to solve the riddle by fundamentally reorienting the way that people read the Treatise (see, e.g., pp. 61, 69, 270-2).

Let me begin by summarizing three essential elements of The Riddle of Hume's Treatise as Russell does in Part V (of the book's five parts). Specifically, let me explain (i) what Russell identifies as the principal problem with the standard attempts to solve the riddle of the Treatise, (ii) what he claims is the key to solving the riddle, and (iii) what he identifies as the benefits of his proposed reading. According to Russell, the problem with the standard skeptical as well as the standard naturalistic interpretations of the Treatise is that the scholars who offer these readings have failed to recognize the significance of Hume's fundamentally irreligious aims and, consequently, the systematic "hostility and criticism" of religion in his work (see, e.g., pp. 284, 289). As a result, they have largely adopted the view that "the Treatise has little or nothing of a direct or substantial nature to do with problems of religion" (p. vii; see also pp. 10, 225, 268ff).

The key to solving the riddle, on Russell's account, "rests with a full and proper understanding of the irreligious motivations that direct and shape Hume's intentions as manifest" both in the skeptical and in the naturalistic aspects of his work (p. 271). Recognizing Hume's fundamentally irreligious objectives, one recognizes the 'dynamic' (as opposed to 'static') nature of Hume's skepticism. Consequently, one sees that Hume begins by utilizing extreme, Pyrrhonian skepticism for the purpose of curbing dogmatism and subverting a religious conception of philosophical anthropology, as well as its corresponding system of ethics. He finally achieves his aims by using moderate, Academic skepticism for the purpose of developing his alternative 'science of man' (see, e.g., pp. 270-2). Hence, Russell's "irreligious interpretation" attempts to solve the riddle of the Treatise by showing that Hume dynamically employs two sets of skeptical principles in an attempt both to discredit a religious world view and to construct a systematic, naturalistic alternative (see, e.g., pp. 270-2, 285-8).

Russell suggests that his proposed solution to the riddle has two principal benefits. First, the "irreligious interpretation" presents a compelling case for a correction in our understanding of the context in which Hume wrote and the significance of various thinkers for his work. The classic skeptical interpretation, as introduced by Reid and Beattie and developed by Green and Grose, suggests that Hume should be understood as an empiricist thinker following in the footsteps of Locke and Berkeley. The naturalist interpretation, as developed by Kemp Smith, suggests that Hume should be understood as a follower of Hutcheson (p. 276; see also pp. 3-6). Russell's interpretation, however, suggests that although a variety of thinkers clearly influenced Hume, Hobbes and Clarke play a particularly salient role in shaping his philosophical thought. In fact, he suggests that, especially with respect to the Treatise, "[i]t is impossible to understand the various particular debates Hume is involved in without giving the Hobbes-Clarke debate suitable prominence" (p. 277; for detailed discussions of the influence of Hobbes, see, e.g., pp. 61-9, 83-98; for similar discussions of the influence of Clarke, see, e.g., 99-112, 113-128, 225-238). Second, the "irreligious interpretation" provides not only a unified and coherent way of reading Hume's master work but also "a very different picture of the unity of Hume's philosophical thought as a whole -- not just in the Treatise but in all his philosophical writings" (p. 275; see also pp. 272-3). On Russell's account, Hume was not merely a skeptic or a naturalist but, more fundamentally, an 'irreligious' thinker whose philosophical corpus provides a comprehensive and systematic naturalistic alternative to a religious (and, more specifically, a Christian) worldview. Moreover, he was a man whose life provides a model of how that worldview, the worldview of virtuous atheism, should be lived (p. 300; cf. pp. 274-7, 290n2).

Having summarized the focus of Russell's project as well as his proposed solution and its purported benefits, let me turn my attention more to the details of the text. In so doing, I would like to highlight two major strengths of the work and two corresponding points of concern.

The first major strength on which I will focus is Russell's careful and detailed explication, in Part I, of the historical context in which Hume wrote. In the first two chapters, Russell nicely motivates his project by identifying the riddle and summarizing the current state of the secondary literature in light of its historical development, and he offers an argument against the classic skeptical interpretation. Specifically, he contends that Hume's project in the Treatise is not merely a negative one in which he shows the problems with modern principles endorsed by Descartes, Locke, or Berkeley. Rather, he argues, Hume intends to advance a system of 'atheism'. The greatest strength of Part I, however, lies in the subsequent three chapters. Russell begins by clarifying the background controversies and identifies both the major and the minor players in the debate between "religious philosophers" and "speculative atheists," elucidating both Hume's context and the perspective of his early critics. Next, he explains the influence on Hume of "the main debate concerning religion and atheism -- specifically, as it concerns Clarke's (Newtonian) philosophy and the 'atheism' of Hobbes, Spinoza, and their followers" (p. 35). He then elucidates the concept of 'atheism', as it was understood in Hume's time -- paying special attention to Hobbes and Spinoza, as its chief defenders (p. 48).

Two things, especially, stand out about Part I of The Riddle. The first is the care with which Russell attempts to clarify the details of Hume's historical context. He explicates the work and influence not only of more familiar figures, such as Hobbes, Spinoza, and Clarke, but also of less familiar and commonly neglected figures, such as Andrew Baxter, Anthony Collins, Pierre Desmaizeaux, William Dudgeon, Matthew Tindal, John Toland, and John Trenchard (see, e.g., pp. 31-3, 39-46). The second is the care with which Russell attempts to clarify the way in which Hume's contemporaries used the term 'atheism'. He distinguishes four forms of 'deism' and explains the relationship of these to 'atheism'. He also identifies the two principal forms of 'atheism' with which Hume's contemporaries were concerned, including both (i) the Pyrrhonian or Skeptical Atheism of Sextus, Hobbes, and Bayle, which "insists on the limits of human understanding in relation to theology," and (ii) what Hume calls 'Spinozism' or what Bayle calls 'Stratonic Atheism', according to which "nature is self-existent, self-ordering, and self-moving" (pp. 54-7). In essence, Russell attentively elucidates "the broad and complex character of 'atheism' and the wide range of debates that were associated with it" in an attempt to clarify the influence that controversies concerning 'atheism' had on Hume's work (p. 57).

The first point of concern on which I would like to focus is Russell's reasoning about the influence of this context on Hume's project. In Part II, using the contextual information he lays out so clearly in Part I, Russell begins to develop his reoriented reading of the Treatise. In particular, he makes a case for two claims. First, he argues that "the scope and structure of Hume's Treatise is modeled or planned after that of Hobbes's The Elements of Law" (p. 61; see also pp. 68-9). Second, he contends that the epigraphs Hume uses on the title pages of the Treatise suggest his allegiances and reveal his "freethinking and irreligious" objectives (pp. 70-1, 79).

This section of The Riddle is, I suspect, one to which Russell's critics will likely raise objections. Discerning a philosopher's intentions is rather difficult, and doing so either (i) by comparing the general structure of Hume's work with that of Hobbes or (ii) by analyzing Hume's use of epigraphs on the title pages of the Treatise might immediately strike some as suspect. Attending to the merits of Russell's arguments should mitigate such an initial impression. Nonetheless, his critics might reasonably come away unpersuaded that Russell has established, say, that "[t]here can be little doubt" that Hobbes "was a major source of inspiration for the young Hume's project of A Treatise of Human Nature" (p. 67) or that "the very face of the Treatise -- its title pages -- reveals Hume's freethinking and irreligious aims and intentions" (p. 79). Although skepticism about the strength with which Russell states some of his specific conclusions in Part II might be warranted, it would be a mistake to reject the general points in these chapters altogether. At the very least, he has made a compelling case (both in Part II and elsewhere in the text) that scholars need to pay more attention to Hume's irreligious influences, such as Hobbes, and to be more attuned to his irreligious motives, in order to make sense of his skepticism, of his naturalism, and of the relationship between the two.

The second major strength on which I will focus is the clarity with which Russell explicates the specific effects that follow from Hume's adoption of a "Hobbist plan," in Parts III and IV. In the interest of space, let me limit my comments to five particularly intriguing points. First, Russell argues that the development of Hume's theory of ideas draws from Hobbes's account, with a similar irreligious aim in mind: namely, to support deep skepticism about the possibility of knowledge of God (p. 83). Second, he contends that Hume's seemingly arcane discussion of space and time is critical for his effort to discredit the Newtonian doctrine of absolute space and, by implication, Clarke's dogmatic theology, which relies on it (p. 99). Third, in a related vein, he elucidates the relevance of Hume's analysis of causation for his critique of "the argument a priori" (p. 113, see also pp. 127-8). Specifically, he argues that Hume's "curious nostrum" -- i.e., "any thing may produce any thing" (T; SBN 173; also; SBN 247) -- undermines the standard causal principles on which the cosmological arguments of Clarke and others rely (see, especially, pp. 119ff). Fourth, he contends that Hume's account of the idea of necessary connexion undermines religious views concerning "the fundamental theological doctrines of omnipotence and Creation" and offers a "comprehensive integrated" naturalistic alternative (p. 166). Fifth, he makes a case that, considered in light of Hume's contemporaries' concern with natural religion, the "fundamental aims and motivations" of his discussion concerning skepticism about the external world "are essentially irreligious in character" (p. 167). Of particular interest in this chapter, is Russell's intriguing exposition of a "concealed or hidden" argument against the existence of God (see, especially, p. 177). In summary, Russell offers a compelling argument, suggesting how the "irreligious interpretation" would require a fundamental reorientation of the way in which scholars read the Treatise (cf. p. 274).

The second point of concern on which I would like to focus is Russell's explication of the scope of Hume's irreligious critiques, which he occasionally mischaracterizes or, at the very least, fails to make clear. Russell suggests that Hume's target is not so much religions, in general, but Christianity, in particular (see, e.g., pp. 25, 127, 144, 225, 269, 284-5, 287-90, 298-9). Moreover, at points, he clearly identifies the rather limited scope of Hume's arguments. For instance, he notes that the objects of Hume's critique are "the systems of natural theology that were most influential in the context of early eighteenth-century British philosophy" (p. 175, emphasis mine; see also pp. 38, 57, 96-7, 184, 188, 230, 299). Similarly, he notes that Hume focuses on "a number of theological issues that were of considerable interest and importance for him and his contemporaries" (p. 165, emphasis mine). Nonetheless, at a number of points, he fails to exhibit the same kind of care in clarifying the religious positions that Hume's arguments might threaten as he does in distinguishing various forms of deism and atheism in the earlier part of The Riddle. For instance, he makes a number of references to "Christianity" (see, e.g., pp. 25, 76, 225, 298) or to "the Christian religion" (see, e.g., pp. 38, 111, 119, 126, 163, 219-20, 276; cf. pp. 109, 144, 164, 185-6, 269, 282, 285, 287-90), which might seem to suggest that the scope of Hume's arguments is much wider.

There are clearly elements of Hume's irreligious program that do have a wide scope. For example, his "concealed or hidden" argument against the existence of God could threaten not merely a few forms of eighteenth-century British Protestant Christianity, but (as far as I know, at least at the time) every dominant form of Judaism, Christianity, and Islam. However, there are also elements of Hume's irreligious program that have a significantly more narrow scope. Examples include his concern with the unknowability of God's essence, his critique of Clarke's doctrine of absolute space, his critique of Butler's argument for a future state, as well as his concerns with the issues of divine simplicity, divine impassibility, and hell as a form of retributive punishment (regarding the latter three, see, e.g., pp. 164, 236, 270).

To elucidate the significance of my concern, let me highlight the issue Russell addresses in his very fine discussion of the eighteenth-century British debate concerning the possibility of having knowledge of the being and attributes of God. In his discussion of Hume's theory of ideas in "Blind Men before a Fire" (Chapter 8, pp. 83-98), Russell clearly articulates the views of Hobbes, Toland, and Collins, which suggest that people cannot know the nature of God. Both Hume and Russell, following the eighteenth-century natural theologians Hume critiques, see this as an argument against an essential Christian doctrine (see, e.g., p. 270). This, however, is exactly the position that Christians of, at least, the first millennium affirm: God's ousia, or nature, is unknowable. What is knowable, they claim, is God's energeia.[1] Thus, Russell's presentation of Hume's position might tempt readers to make the unwarranted inference that Hume develops an argument against a doctrine that is essential to 'Christianity'. The inference they ought to make, however, is much more modest: e.g., that Hume develops an argument against one aspect of a system of natural theology that was "of considerable interest and importance for him and his contemporaries."

The essence of the second concern is this. To the extent that The Riddle fails to illustrate Hume's target with sufficient clarity, it leaves its readers with an ambiguous picture of the scope and success of his arguments. Since debates between the religious and the irreligious are all too often hindered by various forms of (what Hume would call) 'enthusiasm', those engaging in these debates are of greater service to the extent that they bring greater clarity. At many relevant points, The Riddle is an exemplar in this regard. At others, it could be better.

All things considered, Paul Russell's The Riddle of Hume's Treatise is an excellent and thought-provoking text that is a pleasure to read. It provides a compelling case regarding the nature and significance of Hume's 'irreligious' motives. In so doing, it lends further support for a naturalistic reading of Hume, according to which Hume's skepticism serves his naturalism and, ultimately, his 'anti-Christian' motives. It deserves to have an important impact not only on Hume research, but on the narrative that drives undergraduate survey courses in the history of early modern philosophy as well.

[1] For a recent and excellent discussion of this issue with references to the relevant philosophical and patristic sources, see David Bradshaw, Aristotle East and West: Metaphysics and the Division of Christendom (Oxford: Oxford UP, 2007); cf. H. Tristram Engelhardt, The Foundations of Christian Bioethics (Amsterdam: Swets and Zeitlinger, 2000).