The Right to Justification: Elements of a Constructivist Theory of Justice

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Rainer Forst, The Right to Justification: Elements of a Constructivist Theory of Justice, Jeffrey Flynn (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2011, 352pp, $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 978-0-231-147088.

Reviewed by Eva Erman, Uppsala University


The Right to Justification is a collection of essays by Rainer Forst, spanning questions ranging from the foundation of morality to ones of global justice, human rights, toleration, freedom and democracy. Although each essay stands on its own and could be read separately, the book is best read as a monograph since the first part on foundations lays out the ground for, and offers a philosophical and conceptual apparatus to, approaching issues of political and social justice (part 2) and of human rights and transnational justice (part 3). To read the book as a whole also has the advantage of providing insight into Forst's unique ability to connect complex philosophical arguments to everyday social and political practices in the spirit of critical theory, and into his systematic attempt to develop and defend a monist position.

The leading idea of Forst's work is the principle of justification, from which the right to (and duty of) justification corresponds. Forst starts out with the presumption that human beings are foremost justificatory beings, who are not only endowed with a unique capacity for language and communication, but also have the ability to take responsibility for their actions and beliefs by giving reasons to others and expecting that others will do the same. In chapters 1 and 2, Forst unpacks the basic elements of the principle of justification. The ability to justify with practical reason, Forst argues, is the basic capacity to respond to practical questions in an appropriate way. To seek for morally grounded answers to the question "What should I do?", we must be able to provide reasons that can justify our actions according to criteria that are valid within a normative context.

In short, the principle of justification, which is the fundamental principle of practical reason, demands that normative answers are to be justified in the manner referred to by their validity claims. Following Habermas, Forst argues that it must be applied differently in different contexts of justification. Strictly speaking, it is not merely an application of this principle that Forst has in mind here, but an interpretation and recursive reconstruction of the validity claims raised in each justificatory context by way of identifying the conditions for redeeming those claims.

Forst argues that justice is grounded in the principle of justification and is the first and overriding virtue in moral, political and social contexts. The core meaning of justice is found in its opposition to arbitrary rule and the demand for justice is an emancipatory demand to remove relations of domination, the basis of which is the claim to be respected as an agent of justification. The principle of justification corresponds to a moral right to justification, which accommodates two criteria, reciprocity and generality. The defining feature of reasons that can justify moral claims is that they must be reasons that cannot be reciprocally and generally rejected. Here, reciprocity means that no one may make a normative claim that she denies to others or claim to speak in the 'true' interests of others beyond mutual justification. Generality means that reasons have to be sharable by all relevantly affected persons (p. 6). Forst states that the principle itself cannot be justified externally but only 'recursively': it follows from the fact that political and social justice are about norms of a basic institutional structure that claims to be reciprocally and generally valid (p. 259).

Thus, the right to justification is a qualified veto right that takes on a substantive form in a given context of justice and needs to be institutionalized. It forms the basis of human rights (chapter 9) as well as of any justifications of social basic structures. Forst distinguishes between matters of fundamental justice, which define the basic standing of persons and of citizens, and other issues that do not directly concern morally central issues of justice. Matters of fundamental justice call for strict moral-political justification, according to which the criteria of reciprocity and generality are to be interpreted in a strict sense, such that reasons justify norms that possess a morally unconditional normative character and are strictly mutually and universally binding. The other issues call for general political justification, according to which an agreement is justified if it is made in appropriate procedures such that reasons are not morally rejectable and therefore generally acceptable in principle, even though it is neither seen as the best solution by all nor accepted on the basis of the same reasons. In Forst's constructivist terms, the first is a moral constructivism of the basic legal, political, and social structure of justice, while the second is a political constructivism of democratic legitimation of legal, political and social relations among citizens (p. 175).

While the normativity of norms is explained via the principle of justification, the normativity of the principle itself still remains to be clarified to outline the basic presumptions of Forst's theory. In order to capture the practical meaning that the principle of justification acquires in the context of morality, Forst needs to fill the gap between the merely transcendental 'must' and the 'must' of justified norms. In order for the principle of justification to be normatively binding, it is argued that moral persons not only have to have first-order insight into how to justify their actions but also a second-order practical insight that they have a fundamental moral duty of justification. In line with Kant, Forst's argument here is that the ground of morality lies in acknowledging this duty in a practical sense; this is precisely what it means to regard oneself and others as ends in themselves (p. 57).

From this brief sketch of the basic structure of Forst's discourse theory, let me bring up some of the issues in political philosophy to which I think Forst has made an original and important contribution, before concluding with some remarks on questions that I think should be further addressed.

One of the merits of bringing in ideas of philosophers such as Robert Brandom, Stephen Darwall and John McDowell to his Kantian project is that Forst is able to make sense of the premise that a categorical and unconditionally valid morality requires an unconditional ground without the contradictions that follow from Kant's division between the intelligible and the empirical world. This is done through an elaboration of what we might call the dialogical properties of practical reason. To begin with, the second-order insight into the 'that' of justification implies that in moral contexts one owes others justifying reasons (p. 35). Human beings recognize themselves and each other reciprocally as members of the one and only moral community, a community of justification, if you will. Thus, a specific connection between cognition and recognition is essential for Forst's moral theory: cognizing another human being as a human being simultaneously means recognizing her in a practical-normative way as an equal authority in the space of reasons (p. 38). In line with McDowell, Forst argues that cognition is always a spontaneous act that situates us in a space of justifications.

From this dialogical standpoint, Forst argues that Kant traced moral respect for others to the wrong ground, namely, the relation to oneself in terms of a self-reflective appeal to one's own dignity: in a 'kingdom of ends', moral persons are subject only to strictly universal and self-given laws. However, this does not sufficiently explain the specifically moral aspect of the ought, according to Forst, since morality is primarily concerned with the dignity of other persons. For this reason, universalizing a maxim of action is not about an agent asking herself whether her action can be willed generally without contradiction in a monological fashion. Instead, Forst claims, justification is best understood as a discursive process whose primary addressees are those affected in relevant ways. Norms are not binding to the extent that one has acknowledged them as such; they get their normative status in the space of reasons through reciprocal recognition.

Apart from these innovative ideas concerning the dialogical aspects of practical reason, Forst's most important contribution is his account of social justice, which has enriched the debate by broadening and deepening the predominant distribution and goods-centred conception of justice (chapter 8). In Forst's view, the overemphasis on distribution of goods has led not only to a narrow notion of social justice, but also to a notion which does not get to the heart of the matter. For while distributive justice indeed involves the allocation of goods, such a view neglects the fundamental question of how these goods came 'into the world' in the first place and how this production should be justly organized. Justice is not just a matter of which goods are legitimately distributed and for what reasons. Since goods are part of a context of cooperation, their very distribution requires justification (p. 10). To get to the roots of social injustice, Forst argues, the first question of justice must be the question of power. Justice must aim at intersubjective relations and structures rather than the provisions of goods, i.e., at the justifiability of social relations. Subjects are not recipients of justice; rather, justice is an achievement of the subjects themselves. It requires that participants in a context of cooperation be respected as equal in dignity, such that they are equal participants in the social and political order of justification, in which the conditions of the production and distribution are determined by themselves through reasons that cannot be reciprocally or generally rejected (p. 192).

While Forst's account of justice is 'monistic' in nature, established by the right to justification, its proceduralist structure allows it to open up to a pluralism of specific aspects of justice (e.g., need and desert) and the uniqueness of different spheres of distribution according to socially relative criteria. Hence, rather than contributing a particular principle of distribution, such as Rawls's difference principle, it constitutes a higher-order principle for justifying potential distributions under different contextual conditions. From a combination of these monist and contextualist features, Forst shows the limitations of contractualism in addressing transnational justice (chapter 10) and draws out the implications of his own account of justice for the transnational and global context (chapters 11 and 12).

Let me conclude by bringing up two interrelated questions that Forst in my view should address in more detail to strengthen his critical-theoretical project even further, one pertaining to the specification of the right to justification, another pertaining to the question of democracy and democratic legitimacy. Since all core normative concepts defended by Forst are grounded in the one and only principle of justification, it is all the more important to look at the specification of this principle. In contexts of moral justification, as we have seen, it says that all those 'relevantly affected' should have a right to justification. I take it that this is also what is alluded to when Forst speaks about all those 'affected' or 'affected in morally relevant ways'. However, while this is the most frequent specification of the moral right to justification, there are other suggestions that are not fully equivalent. In some places, Forst specifies this right in terms of all those 'possibly affected' and all those 'concretely affected'. Moreover, he speaks about the right not to be 'subjected to' laws, structures, or institutions without justification. The latter is used not only with reference to moral contexts and strict moral-political justification but also to general political justification. In the latter justificatory context also 'affected in politically relevant ways' is used as a criterion.

Now, even if Forst claims that disputes over 'relevantly affected' could only be addressed by way of a process of reciprocal and general justification (chapter 1), this does not properly address the fact that a person can be subjected to a law without being affected in a morally relevant way just as much as she can be relevantly affected without being subjected. Neither does it address the question of by what criterion we should decide when those who have a right to justification are those possibly affected or those concretely affected.

Further, while an 'affectedness' criterion looks promising for strict moral-political justification, there seem to be several advantages with a 'subjectedness' criterion concerning questions of general political justification, since in a democratic community those subjected to laws are subjects (citizens) with a specific legal status, such that either you are a legal subject or you are not. Thus, the criterion is, so to speak, binary coded. By contrast, subjects can be more or less relevantly affected. The difference is crucial for a theory of democracy, since an affectedness criterion allows for proportional influence, which also seems sensible since it is affectedness that motivates a right to have a say in the decision-making in the first place. Consider the alternative, according to which those who are affected should have the same degree of influence. This would draw an indefensible dividing line between those that are not at all affected and those that are very little (relevantly) affected. It would also undermine majority voting as a justified procedure from the standpoint of democracy, since voting on an issue would generate clear winners and losers in light of the fact that it will never be the case that people are equally affected.

The second interrelated question concerns democracy and democratic legitimacy. Against liberal and communitarian theories of democracy (which, according to Forst, are instrumentally justified), a deliberative democratic theory is defended, whose ultimate ground is the basic moral right to justification. In political contexts this right demands the institutionalization of decision-procedures in which relevantly affected (and subjected?) persons can participate as free and as equals (chapter 7). However, it is not clear how Forst gets from an individual right to justification to a theory of collective decision-making ('the rule by the people'). Universal rights alone (legal or moral) cannot substantiate a normative democratic theory mainly because no matter how fully implemented, these rights are individual and could be enforced without any exercise of collective decision-making whatsoever on any level. Hence, it looks as if defining democracy in terms of the right to justification comes at a price for Forst, since it is, at the most, able to offer a theory of democratization, according to which processes of democratization are justified to the extent that they realize or approximate justice as non-domination. Even if it is a principled rather than instrumental justification for democratization, it does not look like a normative theory of democracy.

A strength of Forst's view vis-à-vis Habermas's discourse theory of democracy is that he can give us a justificatory story about the emergence of the legal form (which Habermas simply presumes as an historical fact and couples together with the discourse principle to get a criterion of democratic legitimacy). At the same time, to account for political autonomy -- which is at the center of the political and exercised only jointly with others as members of a political community (chapter 4), according to Forst -- he would have to substantiate a criterion of legitimacy from normative sources within the political that are not reducible to morality (even if the criterion is ultimately grounded in a moral right to justification). It is this autonomy of the political that Habermas attempts to hold on to.