The Risk of a Lifetime: How, When, and Why Procreation May Be Permissible

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Rivka Weinberg, The Risk of a Lifetime: How, When, and Why Procreation May Be Permissible, Oxford University Press, 2016, 263pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190243708.

Reviewed by David A. Jensen, Brigham Young University


Rivka Weinberg argues for a conservative position on the moral permissibility of procreation, albeit with some surprising applications. But the journey to this position is a well-argued, insightful, and lively discussion of the issues surrounding this underappreciated topic. The author considers procreation a risk -- primarily for the person who is procreated -- and establishes the motive that both justifies and explains procreation: the desire to engage in a relationship of parental responsibility for another. That responsibility, Weinberg argues, is incurred by means of a "hazmat theory of parental responsibility."

Using this theory of parental responsibility, she considers both extremes on the permissibility of procreation -- it is almost always permissible and it is almost never permissible. From these extreme positions she articulates two principles that guide permissible procreation: the Motivation Principle and the Balance Principle. These broadly Kantian/Rawlsian principles strike a balance between our desire for procreative liberty and the responsibility to maximize a child's procreative goods. Weinberg concludes by applying her theory to various problems in procreation, including the potential for disability, single parenthood, the use of reproductive technologies, surrogacy, and gamete donation.

In chapter one, Weinberg examines what kind of a thing procreation is and what a justified motive might be for it. Procreation is not a gift, nor a predicament, but a risk we impose on another person for our own benefit. It imposes a risk because the child's life may not go well. As suggested by the title of the book, risk implies an urgent sense of caution and restraint that Weinberg argues should accompany procreation.

Any motive that could justify and explain this risk, however, is fraught with conflicting metaphysical and practical intuitions. On the metaphysical side is the "non-identity problem," from which it follows that any procreative choice appears to harm someone since any choice to delay procreation means a different person will be procreated. Weinberg thinks the metaphysical problems are solvable and addresses them in chapter three. Practically speaking, we value autonomy, equality, benevolence, and altruism. But procreation is done without the child's consent, produces an unequal relationship, and seems both manipulative and selfish. (28). But, of course, no one ordinarily thinks of procreation as an extreme violation of our core values. So what motive could explain procreation as a reasonable and moral undertaking?

The motive that justifies procreation, Weinberg argues, is the "parental motive": the desire to engage in a parent-child relationship (38-40). The parent-child relationship is a unique relationship that is, ideally, mutually beneficial and respectful of the child. It involves nurturing, being nurtured, and the establishment of family ties that provide security, friendship, and intimacy.

At times implied by Weinberg, but not explicitly mentioned, is how procreation unites the parents of the child: they unite not only in rearing the child together, but also in the actual combination of their genetic material into a person who shares in part their looks, talents, dispositions, personality and character qualities, and so forth. This fact strengthens Weinberg's endorsement of the parental motive, though its omission points to a tension throughout the book. That is, most of the discussion has the tone or perspective of an individual's reproducing despite the fact that procreation obviously involves two persons. This may just be for the sake of simplifying the discussion, and Weinberg in fact strongly endorses two-parent child rearing (225). But at times the scenarios discussed in the book are oversimplified because they are described from an individual perspective.

If a desire to engage in the parent-child relationship is a justifying motive, then we must understand how one has and obtains parental responsibility. In chapter two, Weinberg rejects several theories: voluntary commitments, intent to raise, gestationalism, causation, geneticism, and hybrid theories. These theories fail for a variety of reasons, frequently because they entail that either too many or two few persons possess parental responsibility.

Weinberg is careful to focus on parental responsibility and not "parents." If a man's sperm is stolen he may be the parent of the resulting child, but intuitively he will not have parental responsibility. This is an important distinction as we consider Weinberg's own theory, the hazmat theory of parental responsibility. The theory is simple and compelling: gametes are dangerous material, they have the potential to create a person with enormous needs and all the potential risks of life. Therefore, just as we are responsible for hazardous materials or objects that may be in our possession (say, an automobile), we are also responsible for our gametes. If one engages in sexual intercourse and a child results (even due to faulty contraception), then one has acquired parental responsibility.

An underlying assumption, though not discussed by Weinberg, is that no child is without someone "parentally" responsible for him or her, so a theory that fails to assign a responsible party (or assigns too many) is incorrect. One could argue that a correct theory of procreation need not assign parental responsibility in the first place, though this would certainly be more extreme. There is an additional consideration that Weinberg hints at, though does not develop. It is not merely that one's gametes have the potential to produce a person, but that they have the potential to produce a person who is in many ways like his or her parents: the child shares the parents' looks, some of their talents, some of their shortcomings, and so forth. This would seem to strengthen the hazmat theory since the genetic parent can uniquely relate to his or her genetic children.

Weinberg discusses two counterintuitive results of her hazmat theory: it opposes gamete donation, and it casts a shadow on adoption -- both cases of attempted transfer of parental responsibility. Some cases of gamete donation are obviously problematic on her theory. For instance, sperm donors typically have no involvement in the children that result from their donation and cannot provide parental responsibility or ensure that it is provided for. But her primary opposition to transferring parental responsibility stems from the responsibility to love. Says Weinberg, "it is hard to see how we can transfer personal commitment to personally relate to another person in a particular emotional way" (75). But what about adoption, which appears to effect such a transfer? Weinberg argues that because adoption is usually a case of making the best out of a bad situation, its practice does not support "elective" transfer of parental responsibility.

Weinberg seems correct that current practices of gamete donation fail the hazmat theory of parental responsibility. But her argument against adoption or targeted gamete donation -- donation in which one knows the persons who will take on parental responsibility -- seems problematic. While indeed one person's love for a child cannot be transferred to another, a particular child does not obviously need any particular person's love. He or she needs only the love characteristic of a parent. Already it is the case that a father may lovingly relate to a child differently than its mother. So why not another father who will be different from the "father" who donated his sperm?

We could regard such a situation as transferring parenthood without transferring parental rights, but that would seem odd given all the responsibilities the new parents will incur. Further, what do we make of an adopted child whose parents are killed? Surely the new parents have full parental responsibilities. And if so, then why not in a case in which the parents continue to live. This is not to say that parents don't have some responsibility to the children they adopt out, nor does it suggest that a transfer could happen successfully mid-childhood, when a child already identifies with one or two persons as his or her parent or parents. But it seems like it could successfully be transferred under the right circumstances.

None of this implies that adoption or targeted gamete donation are not problematic in other ways. Weinberg's argument would have more force if she included, as suggested above, the matter of a genetic relationship. Part of what may make parents' love for their genetic child special, and so non-transferrable, is that it is based on shared qualities, looks, temperament, traits, talents, and so forth. That sort of intimate relationship will be lost if the child has non-genetically related parents.

In chapter three, Weinberg considers when is it permissible to use this hazardous material by considering two extreme views: procreation is almost always permissible and procreation is almost never permissible. The permissibility argument is based on the so-called "non-identity problem," the problem of finding someone wronged by procreative acts. For example, a teen parent that waits until she is older to have a child will not have benefited that child, for it will be a different child she has when she is older. In fact, she will have harmed that child by not procreating. From this it supposedly follows that as long as a life is minimally worth living, then procreation, including the teen mother's, is justified (85).

Weinberg thinks this is simply a mistake: no one is deprived of existence (by procreative choices) because no one exists to be deprived (85). In fact, because one has to exist to have benefits or harms, existence is not itself a benefit or a harm, it is a condition for having benefits or harms (92). But even if the non-identity problem remains a problem, most ethical theories avoid it. For example, a consequentialist ethics prioritizes aggregate value, so the harm to an individual over non-existence is not necessarily a problem. Even deontological theories, which focus on the individual, avoid the problem since their focus is primarily on the individual performing the action, not the recipient of action.

The other extreme, addressed in chapter four, is that all or most procreation is wrong. The argument is straightforward: life is bad, or likely to be bad, procreation imposes life, and ipso facto, a bad life, on someone, and so it is wrong to procreate. Weinberg resists this conclusion because subjectively people tend to affirm life, and we can't objectively show it to be bad, in part because its goodness is to a degree subjective.

Here her argument may move too quickly. The problem is not that we can't say that life is objectively good or bad. The problem is that life is not necessarily objectively bad. We can image circumstances in which life and the circumstances of childhood are objectively bad -- Weinberg mentions slavery, for example. Such conditions may obtain and perhaps do obtain in many parts of the world today, or they may obtain in some circumstances of birth (e.g. being born with severe birth defects), but they do not necessarily or universally obtain.

Weinberg also rejects Seana Shiffrin's argument that procreation is impermissible because it is done without the child's consent. Weinberg responds that children cannot consent, and we can assume hypothetical consent. Although Weinberg gives a strong response to Shiffrin's objections, it is unclear why Weinberg doesn't summarily dismiss the argument using the previous chapter's argument: we cannot deprive non-existing persons of the opportunity to consent anymore than we can deprive them of existence.

With the extreme views set aside, Weinberg proposes in chapter five a broadly Kantian/Rawlsian principle based account of when procreation is permissible. This view balances the procreative liberty of parents with the procreative goods of the child. These procreative goods include physical health, education, social connectedness, self-respect, freedom from oppression, and so forth. This view includes two principles:

Motivation Restriction: "Procreation must be motivated by the desire and intention to raise, love and nurture one's child once it is born" (176).

Procreative Balance: "Procreation is permissible when the risk you impose as a procreator on your children would not be irrational for you to accept as a condition of your own birth (assuming that you will exist), in exchange for the permission to procreate under these risk conditions" (179).

These principles have strong intuitive appeal, especially since Weinberg is considering procreation for the sake of the parental motive, not for third-party reasons.

The import of these principles is seen by their application to problems in chapter six. For example, the costs of a disease such as Tay-Sachs, and the risk that a child will inherit it if a parent is a carrier, means that procreation in such a case is impermissible. The same holds for diseases like Huntington's or Cystic Fibrosis. However, color-blindness, polydactylism, depression, and many other mental illnesses are less significant or adequately treatable; thus procreation in these cases is permissible. While being born into poverty is certainly a negative, the parent-child relationship so benefits the equally impoverished parents that procreation is likely permissible, though such a situation would warrant only one or two children, not six impoverished children. As mentioned previously, Weinberg's theory does come out strongly against gamete donation and what we could call "elective" adoption.

Weinberg offers an interesting and well argued account that while largely justifying traditional procreative practices -- practices which we typically find acceptable -- does so in a compelling and thought provoking manner. Further, she convincingly argues in general against the excesses of so called "procreative liberty," something that in some debates seems to be appealed to uncritically. Weinberg rightly and strongly makes the case that such liberty must be balanced against the morally weightier well-being of the child.

However, in Weinberg's concluding chapter, one wishes for more development or precision in the application of her theory. For example, we can often know with statistical certainty the odds that a child will inherit a disease his or her parent carries. But Weinberg doesn't specify or argue for why one percentage, 25% chance of inheritance, over another, say 5%, is unacceptably risky. Nor do her principles help us make this demarcation. This may be an impossible request, but the problem needs to be addressed. Likewise, the application of her theory against the transfer of parental responsibility does not seem conclusive, though she has clearly shown it is a discussion worth having.

Further, it would be interesting to see how Weinberg's theories relate to other closely related issues: abortion and third-party reasons for procreation. For example, some nations (such as France) explicitly promote child-bearing not for the sake of the parent-child relationship, but for the sake of national and cultural continuity. Additionally, some argue that environmental concerns demand significant procreative restraint. Weinberg's views certainly provide a framework of constraints that these theories would have to engage. But these are not necessarily deficiencies in the book, rather they are exciting future possibilities for how her views on procreation might to be extended to additional topics.