The Romance of Individualism in Emerson and Nietzsche

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Mikics, David, The Romance of Individualism in Emerson and Nietzsche, Ohio University Press, 2003, 263pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0821414968.

Reviewed by Steven G. Affeldt , University of Notre Dame


All students of Nietzsche know of his profound admiration for Emerson’s writing. However, as Stanley Cavell has observed, this knowledge has mostly been repressed or ineffective; which is to say that the extent, depth, and specificity of Emerson’s influence upon Nietzsche has remained largely unacknowledged and unassessed. In the course of the past decade or so, owing in large part to the influence of Cavell’s own work on Emerson (and Nietzsche), this situation has begun to change. Emerson’s work has increasingly been taken up philosophically, and students of both Emerson and of Nietzsche have begun to explore systematically the relations between them. While the present study devotes considerably more attention to Nietzsche than to Emerson, it constitutes a provocative and important contribution to this work and enriches our understanding of each of these thinkers.

Mikics’ work is ambitious and wide-ranging. He treats many of Nietzsche’s major works, often offering surprising and original interpretations of them, as well as several of Emerson’s most important essays. Furthermore, and remarkably given the quantity of material he considers, his readings are detailed, subtle, keyed closely to specific passages, and directed toward highlighting the complexities, internal tensions, and rifts within the individual works. This last feature of Mikics’ readings represents a laudable, and generally successful, effort to respond to Emerson’s and Nietzsche’s texts as embodying a lived process of thought by individuals gripped by, exploring, and trying to work through, contrary tendencies and shifting moods.

Without attempting to do justice to the many turns and nuances of Mikics’ argument or to the details of his readings, I want to indicate something of the scaffolding upon which the argument unfolds with a view toward sketching some of its main claims and entering a few questions.

Mikics specifies and traces a number of important, inter-connected affinities between Emerson and Nietzsche. However, the most central affinity he explores is their shared pursuit of what he calls individuality; a pursuit he associates with a type of perfectionism. That is, Mikics understands the work of Emerson and Nietzsche to begin from a shared judgment that human beings have failed to achieve individuality; a condition that he argues they associate with freedom and originality as well as with a kind of integrity or coherence in one’s actions and beliefs while remaining open to change and transformation. Accordingly, he claims, in a somewhat problematic phrase, that for Emerson and Nietzsche humans do not yet exist as “fully created” (p.1). Against their shared “dream of individual power” (p. 1), Mikics points out that these thinkers judge humans to exist in unthinking conformity to the ways of speaking and acting that surround them, or as though frozen within mere repetition of the history that preceded them (and so unable to themselves become historical beings with a critical consciousness of the past as well as an open future), or as though taking themselves to be trapped within an impersonal and inexorable fate or necessity which mocks any idea of individuality or freedom.

However, while Emerson and Nietzsche each begin from the bleakest of judgments about the condition in which humans mostly exist (in “The American Scholar” Emerson speaks of humans living as bugs or spawn), their work does not merely condemn nor does it succumb to despair or pessimism. Rather, Mikics argues, their writing is largely devoted to articulating the nature of individuality, exploring why it is mostly not and how it may be achieved, and, through their writing itself, working to enable or provoke that achievement for themselves and others.

Within this shared project, Mikics elaborates many more specific points of contact and traces central aspects of Emerson’s influence on Nietzsche. He warns, however, against too closely assimilating the two. He wishes “to outline a dynamic relation in which Nietzsche struggles with Emerson’s influence and example in order to develop his own path” (p. 2), and he focuses in large part upon articulating what he regards as decisive differences in the ways each understands and seeks the achievement of individuality. His reason for this focus goes beyond the ordinary intellectual scrupulousness that seeks to register differences where they exist, and lies at the heart of the most central and interesting concern of this work.

As just suggested, Mikics reads Nietzsche’s major works, from The Birth of Tragedy through Ecce Homo, as a series of differing efforts to inherit or to respond to aspects of the Emersonian work of individuality. Through tracing these efforts, and through showing why in each case Nietzsche was, finally, unable to accept Emerson’s vision, Mikics seeks to show “current notions of perfectionism to be overly optimistic” (p. 21). He argues that Nietzsche’s work, unlike Emerson’s, shows that a “perfectionist impulse” toward self-transformation and self-invention risks becoming entangled in ascetic “self-punishment” or “moral masochism” (p. 21). And while he sees Nietzsche struggling against this risk in The Gay Science—seeking to replace what he argues is the ultimately tragic “aspiration for a completed, aesthetically finished existence” with a comic “embrace [of] one’s life in all its irrevocable incompleteness” (p. 183)—Mikics reads Ecce Homo as showing that in the end, for Nietzsche, the only escape from the ascetic self-laceration of the Genealogy amounted to a ruinous dissolution of the self into a series of shifting masks. “Scattered into his texts,” Mikics argues, in Ecce Homo “Nietzsche becomes ’Nietzsche,’ a new sign or password.” However, this new sign “promises not victory, but ruin, the catastrophic taking apart of what we had built for ourselves” (p. 225). (It should be noted that Mikics’ arriving at this view of Ecce Homo rests, at least in part, upon a very puzzling translation of ’ein Aufbau’ as ’a taking down.’) One of the central aims driving Mikics’ work, therefore, and another reason for his resisting too closely assimilating Emerson and Nietzsche, is to explore whether, and if so how, what he sees as the ruinous fate of Nietzsche’s quest for individuality can be avoided.

In exploring the quest for individuality in both Emerson and Nietzsche Mikics employs a distinction drawn from Nietzsche’s work between an Apollinian or architectonic conception of the self and a Dionysian or musical conception of the self. The Apollinian conception of the self presents the achievement of individuality as, roughly, arriving at a well integrated, settled and stable identity that can be understood as solidly grounded within (its own individual) history and within the necessities of the natural order. The Dionysian conception of the self presents the achievement of individuality as, equally roughly, arriving at a freedom from constraint by the past (the historical past as well as one’s own past) and by one’s society that enables a kind of spontaneity, creativity, originality, and playfulness in yielding to shifting moods and assuming different masks. These two conceptions are clearly in tension. From the standpoint of the Apollinian the Dionysian seems to represent a chaotic dispersion of the self, and from the standpoint of the Dionysian the Apollinian seems to represent a freezing of the self amounting to a kind of death in life. Mikics, quite plausibly, argues that Emerson and Nietzsche each seek to articulate conceptions of individuality that integrate or harmonize these two contrary tendencies, and he further argues that Emerson is able successfully to do so and that Nietzsche is not.

A significant part of the value and interest of Mikics’ study lies in his carefully detailing the distinct ways in which Nietzsche attempted to integrate the Apollinian and Dionysian at different stages of his authorship, as well as how these distinct efforts resulted in different conceptions of individuality, and specifically how and why, in each case, these efforts came to grief. However, Mikics places at the heart of his discussion of each of these attempts, and in particular of their coming to grief, the Lacanian concept of the “object a.” Briefly, the object a is the mark of an essential incompleteness of the self. It is a “disfiguring surplus” or “the self’s crucial, secretive, ’missing piece’,” that shows the imaginary unity and wholeness of the ego to be illusory (p. 61). “The object a” Mikics writes, “is a piece of the Real, which cannot be assimilated in Symbolic terms” (p. 61). What is most crucial about the object a for Mikics is that it at one and the same time drives the self’s wish for wholeness (and in so doing leads it into ascetic self-laceration), and, as a surplus that disfigures our imaginary wholeness, frustrates that wish.

For some readers, the prospect of drawing upon Lacan to illuminate Nietzsche, or pretty much anything, may well seem less than promising. However, Mikics’ deployment of the concept of the object a is quite illuminating in accounting for the vicissitudes of Nietzsche’s quest to formulate, and achieve, a satisfying conception of individuality. What is more problematic is his account of Nietzsche’s final inability to do so and of his final undoing in Ecce Homo.

Drawing on Zizek’s reading of Lacan, Mikics argues that escape from the circuit of self-laceration and frustration depends upon “identifying, and identifying with, the object a, the senseless, humiliating, or traumatic center of his being” (p. 218). He then argues that, for Nietzsche, the object a is “the woman,” and more particularly his mother and sister, and that “identifying with it will mean destruction rather than critical self-consciousness” (p. 218). Without sketching the details of Mikics’ account of why Nietzsche’s identification with the object a will mean destruction, two linked problems or questions are raised by this claim; a claim which, as noted above, rests in part on a puzzling translation. First, Mikics is here reading Ecce Homo as directly, or simply, autobiographical, and this may well be challenged. For while there is an evident autobiographical cast to the text, Nietzsche, following St. Augustine and Rousseau, equally evidently intends to depict aspects of his own life and experience as representative of more general structures and issues. Second, and more importantly, in reading Ecce Homo as simply autobiographical, Mikics seems to reduce the fate of Nietzsche’s identification with the object a to merely a problem for Friedrich Nietzsche. However, to the extent that this is the case, the ultimate undoing of the self that Mikics finds in Ecce Homo will be understood as a consequence of Nietzsche’s own individual pathology rather than as a consequence of his conception of individuality itself. And that, in turn, will significantly weaken the force of Mikics’ central claim that Nietzsche’s fate, as he understands it, reveals a danger internal to any Nietzschean project of perfectionist individualism.

In contrast to the torment and final catastrophe that Mikics finds in Nietzsche’s attempts to integrate the Apollinian and the Dionysian, he understands this integration to be entirely unproblematic in Emerson. It is not something achieved but something (to be recognized as ) given, and, for Mikics, the project of Emersonian individuality is entirely untouched by the problem of asceticism and its attendant risks of ascetic self-laceration and moral masochism.

Mikics offers several, related, reasons for these claims. What is most central, however, is his appeal to what he calls “the Emersonian gospel of the continuity between human work and the work of nature” (p. 7). Mikics argues, that is, that for Emerson there is some underlying principle or force operating within both human work and the work of nature that ensures that, even if we do not immediately recognize it, our spontaneous, Dionysian, actions, beliefs, utterances, loves, and the like will be integrated into an Apollinian integrity and order. This gospel, as Mikics puts it, “offers a reconciliation of impulse and poise, instinct and calculation” (p. 7). Further, Mikics suggests that this gospel frees Emerson’s conception of individuality from the entanglements with the other or the object a that he finds in Nietzsche and that drive the ascetic impulse. For Emerson, he claims, “illuminated moments of power or self-reliance authenticate us, even in our aloneness, with a clarity that shines through our meetings with others” and afford “a hermeneutic peace” (p. 3). And finally, because this gospel allows him to be “more interested in momentary inspiration and the choice fragment of experience than in a deliberate organization of one’s life as truly personal and owned history, Emerson cannot measure the influence of the past, the conformity that has lived within and through us, on our present lives” (p. 19). Or, as Mikics also puts this, Emerson has “little sense of … the inescapable pain of a history that lives on within the self, not merely as unthinking custom but as the self’s deepest and hardest identity” (p. 17).

Mikics is surely right to emphasize Emerson’s conviction in the harmony of genuine actions. In “Self-Reliance” he says that there “will be agreement in whatever variety of actions, so they be each honest and natural in their hour.” And in his most Dionysian essay, “Circles,” even while claiming that upon the appearance of a thinker “all that we reckoned settled shakes and rattles; and literatures, cities, climates, religions, leave their foundations and dance before our eyes,” he affirms that “all nature is the rapid efflux of goodness executing and organizing itself.” It needs to be considered, however, and Mikics does not, how Emerson arrives at, and undertakes to justify, this conviction. While fundamental to Emerson’s thought, it is not simply an article of faith. It is, rather, something tested in each of Emerson’s essays, and demonstrated, if it is in any individual case, in their surprising coherence.

It is less clear that Mikics is correct in claiming that this Emersonian gospel leads him to fail to appreciate the ways in which the work of individuality must confront the problem of others and history. Indeed, Mikics is not always successful in avoiding the familiar condescension to Emerson that he would clearly condemn. With respect to the problem of our entanglement with, even inhabitation by, others, even if it does not take the same form as in Nietzsche, it is present. Emerson’s writing is in constant struggle with the voices of, for example, Plato and Shakespeare that he finds to haunt his own. And if there are moments of “hermeneutic peace,” in which the self feels itself fully authenticated, those moments are invariably challenged or called into question by the next moment. With respect to the problem of history, Richard Poirier has powerfully argued (in, for example, his essay “The Question of Genius”) that Emerson is excruciatingly aware of the way in which history “lives on within the self, not merely as unthinking custom but as the self’s deepest and hardest identity.” This history, Poirier argues, is carried in our language and so is reinforced and reinscribed in every act of speech or writing. Accordingly, he argues that both Emerson’s style and his conception of genius are structured by an effort to defeat, even if only in moments, history’s power of dictation.

Setting these reservations about Mikics view of Emerson to one side, there is a more disturbing problem, or set of questions, raised by his study. Mikics clearly regards Emerson and Nietzsche as especially important and powerful representatives of perfectionist individualism. He says that they are “the two strongest antagonists of liberal pieties” he knows (p. 15), and says that they “remain two rival options for contemporary thought” (p. 24). However, if his account of their respective visions of individualism is correct, Nietzsche’s ends in ruin and Emerson’s is a non-starter; for we are not likely to be able to take seriously a conception of individualism that is blind to, or fails to address, the issues of our entanglement with others and in history.

This conclusion may be taken to mean that perfectionist individualism, at least as represented by Emerson and Nietzsche, must be either given up or gone beyond. Mikics himself suggest that their forms of (the quest for) individualism must be gone beyond; suggesting that there is “on the other side of this [ruinous Nietzschean] revolution, perhaps, a new face of individualism” (p. 225). Alternatively, this conclusion may be taken to call for a re-reading of Emerson and Nietzsche, a reading that seeks to find an Emerson that can be taken (more) seriously and/or a less ruined and ruinous Nietzsche. Anyone interested in either working out an individualism that goes beyond those of Emerson and Nietzsche or in attempting a re-reading of Emerson and Nietzsche that establishes a greater viability for their visions, will need to grapple with, and will be helped by, Mikics work.