The Russell/Bradley Dispute and its Significance for Twentieth-Century Philosophy

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Stewart Candlish, The Russell/Bradley Dispute and its Significance for Twentieth-Century Philosophy, Palgrave Macmillan, 2007, 235pp., $84.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780230506855.

Reviewed by James Levine, Trinity College, Dublin


Stewart Candlish's aspirations in this thoughtful, careful, and gracefully written book are both ambitious and modest. Ambitious, in that he seeks not merely to clarify what is at issue in the ongoing debate between Bertrand Russell and F.H. Bradley from 1900 to 1924 but also to challenge what he regards as the "stereotypical picture" of the dispute and, more specifically, to argue that with regard to what is "perhaps the most central matter of all" involved in the dispute, namely "the topic of relations" (141), Bradley is "unanswerably correct" (168; see also xi), so that "the comfortable pluralism now so often just taken for granted by philosophers will have to be reconsidered" (185). Modest, in that in criticizing the stereotypical picture of the dispute, Candlish is not attempting to provide a complete and systematic presentation of the views of either philosopher and that in favoring Bradley over Russell on the topic of relations, he is not undertaking a full-scale defense of the most dramatic, and currently unfashionable, features of Bradley's system, as, for example, his monism, his idealism, his doctrine of degrees of truth, or his view that with the "consummation" of thought in the full realization of the Absolute, thought has "been so transformed" as to have committed its "happy suicide" (1893, 150-2). Candlish's larger purpose here is not to urge a prominent place in the curriculum for Bradley, whose prose he variously describes as "florid, abstract, and obscure" (2, see also 24), "maddeningly imprecise" (178), and "guaranteed to irritate a more straightforward reader" (84), and of whom he writes: "it would be quite characteristic of him to defend initially some more or less plausible view only to abandon it later for something extreme and highly implausible" (146). Rather, it is to draw the lesson that we stereotype past philosophical positions (something he believes is already happening with regard to the later Wittgenstein) and assume the correctness of inherited "verdicts of history" to our own philosophical detriment.

The book is divided into seven main chapters. In the first, Candlish introduces the stereotypical picture of the dispute, a picture that is shaped largely by how Russell and G.E. Moore characterize their opposition to Bradley, and that has worked its way into standard reference works within the analytic tradition. It consists of a number of contrasts, such as that, unlike Russell and/or Moore, Bradley was not a logician, was a metaphysician "in some pejorative sense" (5), disdained science and common sense, and "simply failed to see obvious facts" (6) and that whereas Russell adhered to a correspondence theory of truth, Bradley accepted a coherence theory of truth. And it involves further contrasts regarding the topic of relations, as that, unlike Russell and Moore, Bradley accepted a "Doctrine of Internal Relations" as an unargued-for axiom or dogma, a doctrine that requires (according to Russell) that all relations are reducible to properties or (according to Moore) that no relations hold contingently. Further, on the stereotypical picture, not only was Bradley wrong on most, if not all, of these issues; he was also guilty of elementary blunders, such as confusing identity and predication (according to Russell) or entailment and material implication (according to Moore).

In the next five chapters, Candlish seeks to dismantle the stereotyped picture and with it "analytic philosophy's inherited picture of Bradley" (142). In Chapter 2, "Finding a Way into Bradley's Metaphysics", he provides an introduction to Bradley's system which does not present Bradley as reaching his metaphysical conclusions by simply disregarding common sense, or science, or logic, or by assuming any such "dogma" as the "Doctrine of Internal Relations". Instead, Candlish presents Bradley as relying on an ideal of what it is to "satisfy the intellect" that is reflected in "our practice of intellectual enquiry" (26), an ideal according to which we have succeeded in explaining a given phenomenon just to the extent we have rendered it necessary relative to other phenomena. For Candlish, Bradley's commitment to this ideal functions as a Principle of Sufficient Reason that leads him to regard any ultimate contingency as contradictory (see 37-40) and also to accept his monism (44). Candlish concludes that, while Bradley's position is consistent, it is also "not proven" (78-9), since there is no reason why a "metaphysician of contingency" should accept such a Principle of Sufficient Reason as what is required to "satisfy the intellect" (see 46-8).

In Chapter 3, "Judgment", Candlish focuses on the various accounts of propositional "unity" that Russell proposed from 1903 through 1919. These include the view in his 1903 book The Principles of Mathematics (PoM); three different versions of the "multiple relation" theory of judgment he developed and rejected in rapid succession in 1910-13, including the account in his 1913 manuscript The Theory of Knowledge, which he abandoned as a result of Wittgenstein's criticisms; and the view he came to endorse by 1919 in the wake of those criticisms. In contrast with his earlier verdict on Bradley's system, Candlish argues that each version of Russell's multiple relation theory of judgment is inconsistent. Further, for Candlish, Russell overcomes this inconsistency in his system by learning from Wittgenstein, what he could have earlier learned from Bradley, that "relations are unreal" (see 75-7, also 52-3, 130).

In Chapter 4, "Truth", Candlish attacks the stereotype that while Russell adhered to a correspondence theory of truth, Bradley accepted a coherence theory according to which truth "consists in (some sort of coherence) between representational entities rather than in correspondence between representational items and the represented" (80). For Candlish, the Russell side of this stereotype is at best misleading: since Russell endorsed a correspondence theory of truth only in accepting the "multiple relation" theory of judgment, accepting a correspondence theory was not central to his revolt against idealism. The Bradley side of the stereotype is, however, simply false: for Bradley always held that "the truth or falsehood" of a judgment does "not lie in itself" but rather involves "a reference to a something beyond" -- a "fact" or "reality" -- "about which or of which we judge" (see 82-3). While this may suggest that Bradley is some form of a correspondence theorist, Bradley rejects any correspondence view as ultimately unsustainable -- for reasons, argues Candlish (89-92), similar to those presented by Frege -- and he accepts instead what Candlish calls an "identity theory of truth", according to which a judgment is true to the extent to which it is identical with the reality it is about.

In Chapter 5, "Grammar and Ontology", Candlish focuses on a central aspect of Russell's early understanding of how his position differs from Bradley's -- namely, that whereas Bradley is committed to the view that no linguistic or "discursive" form can be an adequate representation of reality, Russell in The Principles of Mathematics (PoM) presents language as "transparently" providing us with a "window on the world" (109). However, as Candlish argues, this apparently straightforward contrast becomes less clear the more closely one examines Russell's development, including the theory of denoting concepts he advances in PoM; the theory of "On Denoting" with which he replaces it and which incorporates views similar to those of Bradley; and Russell's eventually denying, under the influence of Wittgenstein, first, that connectives such as "and" and "or" serve to designate logical constants, and second, shortly thereafter, that relational expressions must designate relations in order to be meaningful. For Candlish, "the stark contrast with which Russell began has to be replaced by a much fuzzier picture" (140).

In Chapter 6, "Relations", Candlish "intend[s] to sort out … for good and all" (144), the dispute over relations between Russell and Bradley. He devotes most of the chapter to dispelling various confusions surrounding the debate incorporated in the "stereotypical picture"; however, by its end he argues that "the real issue" at stake between Bradley and Russell is whether "relations are real" understood as the issue as to whether "relations are substances" or, in its linguistic form, as the issue as to whether relational expressions are to be construed as names (159, 167, see also 32, 130). And with regard to this issue, he claims (168-70) not only that Russell accepts the view that Bradley is attacking, but also that Bradley's most well-known argument against the view that "relations are real" -- the so-called regress argument in Chapter III of Appearance and Reality -- does not deserve its "bad press" (170). On the contrary, this is the argument that Candlish attempts to show "is unanswerably correct".

Having taken himself to have established that the victory of Russell over Bradley, at least as a matter of historical fact, was not determined by the merits of the arguments, Candlish speculates briefly in his concluding chapter, "Decline and Fall", on other reasons for the ascendancy of metaphysics in the style of Russell over Bradleian monistic idealism. These include the view that Russellian pluralistic metaphysics can better accommodate the twentieth-century revolutions in physics or mathematical logic than can Bradleian monism as well as the more general sense that Russell's philosophy, unlike Bradley's, provides one with something "to do" (179) in philosophy -- a research program. And he suggests further, more broadly cultural, reasons for the decline of British idealism, including its associations with an outdated Victorian society and with British imperialism, and the "gradual fading of the need" for metaphysical views that provide an obvious "substitute for religion" (182).

The book should be of interest not only to Russell and Bradley scholars but also to the larger audience Candlish hopes to reach of those who have inherited the stereotypical picture of the dispute to the extent of assuming that Russell was the deserved victor as well as to those with an independent interest in such topics as truth or the "unity" of the proposition. In his attempt not only to do justice to Bradley and Russell separately but also to arrive at a fair assessment of how things stand dialectically between them, Candlish makes a genuine contribution to, as well as the case for, the relatively neglected philosophical genre of "philosophers in interaction" (18-9, see also xii), a kind of study that is particularly well-suited to identifying and challenging fundamental philosophical assumptions. If in what follows, I take issue with, or raise questions concerning, some aspects of Candlish's discussion -- particularly, as it pertains to the topic of the "unity" of the proposition, to Bradley's so-called regress argument, and to how Wittgenstein's and Frege's positions stand to those of Bradley and Russell -- it is in the attempt to contribute to that project.

First, and most generally, Candlish does not, I think, clearly distinguish the general metaphysical topic of complex unity from that of the "unity" of the proposition. As a monist, Bradley denies that any complexity can be understood in terms of metaphysically distinct and independent entities somehow combining to form a unified complex; and it is against that view that the argument of Chapter III of Appearance and Reality is directed. Insofar as propositions are unified complexes, they present one case of the problem of complex unity; however, there are other problems associated with the "unity" of the proposition -- such as how propositional thought that aRb, unlike any mere listing of entities, can be either true or false -- that are distinct from that general problem. In PoM, Russell regards propositions as complex unities, indicating, in fact, that all complex unities are propositions (§136);[1] by 1910, he denies that there are any complex unities that are propositions but continues to hold that there are complex unities,[2] which he comes to call "facts".[3] Moreover, while he has significantly changed his approach to the issue as to how propositional thought can be either true or false, his general account as to how complexes are "unified" remains both unchanged from PoM and incompatible with Bradley's monism.

Thus, for Russell in PoM, the proposition 'Socrates is older than Plato' is a complex unity containing three constituents -- Socrates and Plato themselves and the relation of being older than. In holding that the constituents of a proposition are the actual entities in the world that are designated by the words in a sentence expressing that proposition -- rather than representational items (such as Fregean senses or mental representations) that somehow determine those designated entities -- Russell accepts what Candlish calls "the doctrine of real propositional constituents" (54). Further, to account for propositions as unified complexes, Russell distinguishes between "things" and "concepts". For Russell, while "things" can function only as "logical subjects" of propositions and are incapable of playing "unifying" roles "concepts" (including both predicates and relations) admit of a "curious twofold use" (§48), according to which they are capable of functioning either as "logical subject", in which case they are not supplying "unity" to propositions, or "as verb", in which case they are. Thus, while the relation of difference is functioning as "logical subject" in the proposition 'Difference is a relation' and so is not there supplying "unity", that same relation is "actually relating" from Socrates to Plato in 'Socrates differs from Plato', thereby "unifying" that proposition.

As Candlish emphasizes, combining "the doctrine of real propositional constituents" with this account of propositional unity may seem to create a difficulty regarding falsity. For if the proposition that aRb is true just in case R "actually relates" from a to b, then Russell's view precludes there being any false propositions. To avoid this conclusion, Russell holds in PoM that truth and falsity are primitive properties of propositions, so that while the relation is older than "actually relates" from Plato to Socrates in the proposition 'Plato is older than Socrates', that proposition happens to have the primitive property of being false. By his (1910b), Russell avoids such "objective falsehoods" by regarding individual acts of judgment, rather than propositions, as truth-bearers and by denying that propositions are complex unities. For Russell, a thinking subject S's judgment that aRb is no longer a two-place or "dual" relation between S and the complex unity aRb; instead, it is a four-place "multiple relation" relating S, a, R, and b, where R now functions as a relation "in itself" and not "as relating". And by denying that R need "actually relate" in order for there to be propositional thought that aRb, Russell now regards himself as able to accept a correspondence theory where what determines whether the judgment that aRb is true is whether there is a unified complex -- a fact -- in which R "actually relates" from a to b.

Thus, while Russell has changed his view of the "unity" of the proposition understood as including the issue as to how propositional thought can be either true or false, he has not changed his account of the metaphysics of complexes. While he now recognizes facts, but not propositions, as unified complexes, he still makes a distinction between relations "in themselves" and "as relating"[4] and still holds that what supplies the "unity" to a complex is a relation "as relating" (be it a two-place relation R in a fact that aRb or the four-place relation of judging in a fact that S judges that aRb, a fact which also happens to be a truth-bearer). In Chapter 3, Candlish mentions both Russell's acknowledged inability "to give a clear account of the precise nature of the distinction" between a relation "in itself" and "as relating" (§54) as well as the problem of falsity as two difficulties facing his PoM account of the unity of the proposition; and he comments that while Bradley "missed" the second of these problems, he "did not miss" the first (57). But for Bradley, while the former problem bears on the issue of complex unity, the latter concerns distinct issues regarding the nature of propositional thought.[5] Candlish focuses in Chapter 3 on the problem of falsity and in Chapter 6 on Bradley's so-called "regress" argument against relational views of complex unity; and nothing I have claimed so far bears on the arguments of these chapters taken separately. However, his tendency to assimilate these issues under the rubric of the "unity of the proposition" may lead to him to associate Wittgenstein's critique of Russell's "multiple relation" theory too readily with Bradley's general critique of relational accounts of complex unity.

In Chapter 3, Candlish makes the provocative claim that no version of Russell's "multiple relation" theory of judgment can do what Russell designed it to do -- namely, explain propositional thought without having to invoke "objective falsehoods". In particular, Candlish emphasizes that despite no longer regarding propositions as complex unities, Russell continues to hold that the particulars a and b and the relation R -- those entities themselves -- are constituents of any truth-bearer of the claim that aRb; for on the "multiple relation" theory, such a truth-bearer will be a given subject's judgment that aRb, a complex unity that includes a, R, and b themselves as constituents. And for Candlish, this continuing adherence to "the doctrine of real propositional constituents" makes the task that Russell sets for himself "in principle unsolvable" (53). In particular, for Candlish, Russell's theory requires that an act of judgment not only bind "the real things A and B and love, not just mental or linguistic proxies" into a judgeable content, but also do so "without actually making A love B"; but, for Candlish, if the mind could so bind those entities together, it would involve insuring that loving "actually relate" from A to B, and that would be both "magical" (since no act of judging can insure that if it is not so) and also be "inconsistent" with the possibility of false judgment (67).

One might question whether Candlish has fully addressed the details of Russell's 1913 account; for there (1913, 116), Russell formulates this sort of difficulty and indicates that, by introducing "logical forms", he can solve it. For Russell, while the mind cannot actually unite A and B and similarity to each other if they are not already united in the relevant fact, it can relate them to the logical form of "something being related to something", thereby enabling one to know how A and B and similarity would have to be related in order for it to be true that aRb without guaranteeing that it is actually so. However, whether one agrees with Candlish that the introduction of "logical forms" makes the same "inconsistent" demands as earlier versions of the "multiple-relation" theory of judgment, or whether one holds that a more appropriate criticism of Russell's 1913 theory is (as Candlish writes of Russell in another context) that it reflects his "tendency to try to solve a philosophical problem by discerning an object of acquaintance [here, a logical form] which somehow possesses just the right logical properties for the solution" (205, note 34), Candlish's analysis is illuminating. For it points to a central feature of how, influenced by Wittgenstein, Russell avoids problems he faced in his earlier theories.

In particular, by his (1919), Russell holds that truth-bearers are representational items (sentences or mental representations), whose constituents are linguistic or mental items; and by thus rejecting "the doctrine of real propositional constituents", he can have "unified" truth-bearers without having to "unify" the entities in the world relevant to the truth-value of a given truth-bearer, and hence without facing the threat of "objective falsehoods". In particular, by regarding sentences themselves as truth-bearers, he can hold that the symbolic function of a relational expression is not to stand for an entity -- a relation "in itself", on his "multiple relation" theory -- but rather to be related in the appropriate way to the other expressions in that sentence; and by doing so, he can reject the distinction between relations "in themselves" and "as relating", and hold that relations occur only "as relating".[6] However, although he no longer holds that "R" must designate a relation in order for "aRb" to be meaningful, he still holds that in order for "aRb" to be true, there will be a corresponding fact in which R "actually relates" a to b; and in doing so, he still regards himself as accepting a view of complex unity which is opposed to Bradley's monism.[7] To see whether this is so, it is necessary to examine Bradley's argument against "the reality of relations" that Candlish discusses in Chapter 6.

As Candlish points out, the so-called regress argument is only half of a dilemma that Bradley uses to argue that conceiving of reality as consisting of distinct entities standing in various relations with one another "must give appearance, and not truth" (1893, 28). In particular, Bradley introduces the dilemma in order to support his claim that "how the relation can stand to the qualities [which it is to relate] is … unintelligible" (ibid., 27). As he writes:

If it is nothing to the qualities, then they are not related at all; and … their relation is a nonentity. But if it is to be something to them, then clearly we now shall require a new connecting relation. (Ibid.)

Here, it might seem, Bradley is offering us a choice -- either relations are not real (there are no entities that are relations) or they are real (there are entities that are relations) -- and is claiming that neither option will be able to account for complex unities. If there are no entities that are relations, there is literally nothing to connect the "qualities" into a relational "unity"; however, if relations are entities, there will always need to be a further relation to connect any relation to the qualities it was originally meant to connect, thereby launching the infinite regress. Understood in this way, Bradley is assuming that whatever is "real" -- any entity -- is incapable of playing a connective role. Or, assuming Candlish's identification of what is real with what is a "substance", he is assuming both that substances are incapable of playing a connective role and that all entities are substances.

If so, it might seem that Bradley's argument fails to take into account a third option, of the sort that Frege seems to endorse throughout his writings according to which there are two different sorts of entities: objects, which he characterizes as "complete" or "saturated" and incapable of playing a connective role; and concepts, which he characterizes as "incomplete" or "unsaturated" and as needed in order for any "logical connection into a whole" to "come about" (1903, 281). As Frege writes: "An object … cannot logically adhere to another object … without some means of connection. This, in turn, cannot be an object but must rather be unsaturated." (Ibid.) Likewise, with regard to wholes that are thoughts, he writes: "[N]ot all the parts of a thought can be complete; at least one must be 'unsaturated', or predicative; otherwise they would not hold together." (1892, 193) Hence, it might seem that Frege holds, against Bradley, that while some entities -- namely, objects -- are, like Bradley's "substance", incapable of playing a connective role, we should not identify those entities with what is "real", since there are other entities -- namely, concepts -- which are capable of playing a connective role.

However, for Candlish, Frege's talk of "unsaturated" parts of a whole is actually in the spirit of Bradley, and all that is unBradleian in Frege's view is that he recognizes any "saturated" parts of wholes at all. For Candlish, had Bradley used Fregean terminology, he "would have said that all the constituents of a judgment are unsaturated" (52, see also 171). Candlish can thus assimilate Bradley's view to Frege's because he holds that, for Bradley, to deny that relations are real is to hold that they "do not exist independently of their terms" (167) and hence are "false abstractions". And Frege does, in fact, emphasize that he arrives at a concept, or a relation, by "splitting up the content of possible judgment", and that "the ideas of these properties and relations" are not "formed apart from objects" but rather "arise simultaneously with the first judgment in which they are ascribed to things" (1880/81, 17). However, despite this similarity between Bradley's position and Frege's, it is hard to believe that Bradley would regard Frege's position as compatible with the outcome of his argument. For Bradley takes his argument to establish that regarding the world as consisting of distinct entities standing in various relations to one another is "unintelligible" and "must give appearance, and not truth"; but, for Frege, taking relations to be "unsaturated" does not thereby establish that no relational thought can be absolutely true.[8] Further, Candlish does not make clear whether he takes Bradley's argument as compatible with the sort of view suggested by Frege according to which there are "unsaturated" entities of a different "logical type" from "saturated entities", or whether he takes Frege as somehow holding, or at least committed to, the view that what is "unsaturated" cannot be regarded as an entity or as "real" at all. It would seem that there remains more to clarify in Bradley's argument.

One might argue that Frege cannot be regarded as coherently holding, against Bradley, that although concepts are "unsaturated", they are just as "real" as objects. Since, for Frege, concepts and objects can never occupy the same "logical position", he can recognize no notion of "being real" or of "entity", applying alike to concepts and objects, that would enable him to say, in opposition to Bradley, that while concepts, like objects, are real, or are genuine entities, they are also unsaturated. Candlish does not make this sort of point; however, he argues, in effect, that Russell's early commitment to avoiding this sort of difficulty renders him vulnerable to Bradley's argument. For by holding in PoM that "concepts" have a "curious twofold use", Russell can hold, unlike Frege, that concepts can occur in the same "subject" positions as do "things" and that there are certain absolutely universal categories, such as "entity", which apply to both things and concepts (§§47, 49). Candlish takes this difference between Russell and Frege as committing Russell to holding that all the constituents of a proposition are, in Frege's terminology, "saturated" (see, for example, 55-7), and, on that basis, he indicates (57-8, 169-70) that Russell -- at least the Russell of PoM[9] -- is an appropriate target of, and effectively undermined by, Bradley's argument.

However, this seems unfair to Russell. For Russell's view in PoM is that concepts (including relations) are not, in Fregean terminology, intrinsically either "saturated" or "unsaturated"; rather, how a concept functions in a proposition depends upon the position it occupies in that proposition. For Russell, that a relation can occupy the position of "logical subject" in a given proposition does not mean that it is not also capable of functioning so as to supply the "unity" to another proposition. Hence, if the regress side of Bradley's dilemma has force only against a position according to which relations are essentially "saturated" -- that is to say, incapable, in principle, of supplying "unity" to a complex -- it does not apply to Russell's position.[10] Here, as elsewhere, Russell may be criticized for conjuring up entities (here, concepts) that "somehow possess just the right logical properties" (here, their "twofold use") to "solve a philosophical problem" (here, to solve the problem of the unity of the complex in a way that can be coherently stated); but to make that criticism of Russell is different from claiming that he falls directly prey to Bradley's argument.

As I mentioned, when Russell abandons his "multiple relation" theory of judgment, he denies that relations have a "twofold use", thus, in effect, regarding them as intrinsically "unsaturated". Hence, if Candlish is right that to agree with Frege that relations are "unsaturated" is to agree with Bradley that "relations are unreal", he is likewise right to claim that after rejecting the "multiple relation" theory of judgment, Russell has "surreptitiously switched sides to become the new champion of the insubstantiality and unreality of relations" (168). Russell, however, did not thus regard himself as switching sides. For while he emphasizes that on the type distinction he recognizes between relations and particulars, there is no univocal notion of "being real" that applies to both (see, for example, 1918, 225, 232), he also writes that "so far from strengthening their [his monistic idealist opponents'] main position, the doctrine of types leads, on the contrary, to a more complete and radical atomism than any that I conceived to be possible twenty years ago" (1924, 170). For Russell, although the phrase "there are" is "systematically ambiguous" in "There are relations" and "There are particulars", that "There are relations" can be interpreted as being true is enough to undermine Bradley's view that "relations are unreal". Hence, for Russell, as against what Candlish claims, by rejecting his "multiple-relation" theory of judgment and following Wittgenstein in holding that relational expressions do not serve as designating expressions or names, he has not thereby accepted the "unreality of relations". What Russell took from Wittgenstein is that accounting for propositional thought that aRb does not require countenancing a relation R; however, he still holds that in order for there to be a fact that aRb, there will have to be a relation "uniting" the particulars a and b into that fact.

In this respect, Russell's post-Wittgenstein position seems to differ from Wittgenstein's own view in the Tractatus. Wittgenstein indicates not only that in "aRb", "R" unlike "a" and "b" is not a name (see 3.1432), but further that for there to be a state of affairs that aRb, the objects a and b suffice, since objects themselves "hang one in another, like the links of a chain" (2.03). For Russell, since the particulars a and b are "saturated" in Frege's sense, there must be an "unsaturated" relation to "unite" them into the fact that aRb; by holding, in contrast, that no third item is needed for those objects to form a "unified" complex, Wittgenstein is indicating that the objects a and b are themselves "unsaturated" in Frege's sense, thereby adopting what Candlish indicates is the Bradleian position, according to which all constituents of a complex are "unsaturated". For Candlish (171-2), however, while Wittgenstein agrees with Bradley that "relations are unreal", he does not accept Bradley's monism, since he recognizes a plurality of objects. But, again,[11] what was central to Candlish's argument is the identification of "substance" or the "real" with the "saturated": if Wittgenstein's objects are "unsaturated", they are not by that standard "substances" or "real", even if they are nameable, and even if, for Wittgenstein, they "form the substance of the world" (2.021). What meets this standard of the "real" in the Tractatus would, instead[,?] seem to be his "independent" states of affairs, in which case, his pluralism consists in his countenancing a plurality of states of affairs.[12] If Wittgenstein agrees with Bradley that no part of a unified complex is "complete", he holds, as against him, that there is more than one unified complex.

Finally, on a different sort of point, Candlish writes at the outset that he has said "relatively little about [Russell's] attempts to find technical solutions to philosophical problems" because he is concerned to focus, following Bradley, on "the philosophical assumptions underlying technical solutions" (x). But this way of putting things suggests that Russell's technical work was always at the service of a fixed philosophical position. It ignores the possibility that that technical work may have led Russell to alter significantly some aspects of his philosophical position. In addition it suggests that, for Candlish, determining whether there are good reasons (as opposed to historical explanations) for Russell's influence involves assessing only his "philosophical assumptions" -- such as those shaping his approach to the issue of complex unity -- and need not consider his "technical solutions to philosophical problems".

In fact, however, Russell's use of technical work to solve philosophical problems marks a change in his philosophical outlook from his original break with monistic idealism. It dates from his encountering Peano at a philosophy conference in 1900 -- which Russell later called "the most important event" in "the most important year in my intellectual life" (1944, 12) -- almost two years after he rejected idealism. As a result of that conference, Russell became convinced that mathematicians, including Cantor, Dedekind, and Weierstrass, had solved Zeno's paradoxes and all the traditional problems of the infinite (see his 1901); and this became the model for Russell's conception of "the scientific method in philosophy" (see, for example, 1924, 163). This aspect of Russell's work has had a significant influence, and it would be wrong to suppose that those who have been influenced by it (perhaps, most notably, Quine) have therefore embraced, or even taken themselves to embrace, Russell's "philosophical assumptions" in his debate with Bradley. Hence, even if Candlish is right to conclude that Russell should not be regarded as the clear victor over Bradley regarding the topic of complex unity, it does not follow that there is no further task of assessing Russell's "attempts to find technical solutions to philosophical problems".


Bradley, F.H., 1893. Appearance and Reality, Oxford: Clarendon Press, ninth impression 1930 [references to this edition].

Frege, Gottlob, 1880/81. "Boole's Logical Calculus and the Concept-Script", in his Posthumous Writings, edited by Hans Hermes, et. al., translated by Peter Long and Roger White. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1980, 9-52.

-- 1892. "On Concept and Object", reprinted in his Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic, and Philosophy, edited by Brian McGuinness. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1984, 182-94.

-- 1903. "On the Foundations of Geometry: First Series", reprinted in ibid., 273-84.

Johnston, Colin, 2007. "The Unity of a Tractarian Fact", Synthese, Volume 156, 231-51.

Landini, Gregory, 1998. Russell's Hidden Substitutional Theory. New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Levine, James, 1998. "The What and the That: Theories of Singular Thought in Bradley, Russell, and the early Wittgenstein" in Appearance versus Reality, edited by Guy Stock. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 19-72.

Linsky, Bernard, 1999. Russell's Metaphysical Logic. Stanford, California: CSLI Publications.

Russell, Bertrand, 1901. "Recent Work on the Principles of Mathematics", reprinted in The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, Volume 3, edited by G.H. Moore. New York and London: Routledge, 1993, 366-79.

-- 1903. The Principles of Mathematics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

-- 1910a. "The Theory of Logical Types", manuscript published in The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, Volume 6, edited by John Slater. London and New York: Routledge, 1992, 4-31.

-- 1910b. "On the Nature of Truth and Falsehood", reprinted in ibid., 116-24.

-- 1911. "Analytic Realism", reprinted in ibid., 133-46.

-- 1913. Theory of Knowledge: The 1913 Manuscript, edited by Elizabeth Eames. Published in 1984, London: George Allen & Unwin.

-- 1918. "The Philosophy of Logical Atomism", reprinted in The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, Volume 8, edited by John Slater. London: Routledge: George Allen & Unwin, 1986, 160-244.

-- 1919. "On Propositions: What They Are and How They Mean", reprinted ibid., 278-306.

-- 1924. "Logical Atomism", reprinted in The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, Volume 9, edited by John Slater. London: Unwin Hyman, 1988, 162-79.

-- 1944a. "My Mental Development" in The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, ed. Paul A. Schilpp. LaSalle, Illinois: Open Court, 3-20

-- 1944b. "Reply to Criticisms" in ibid., 681-741.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1922. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, translated by C.K. Ogden. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.

[1] References to PoM will be section numbers in parentheses.

[2] See, for example, Russell (1910, 11-2), where he calls "the phrase expressing a proposition" an "incomplete symbol", but also affirms that there are "complexes".

[3] See, for example, Russell (1913, 79-80; 1919, 278; 1924, 172).

[4] Although note that there is an issue as to whether in doing so, Russell still holds that when they occur as entities "in themselves", relations occupy subject-positions which may also be occupied by particulars. Compare Landini (1998, 277) and Linsky (1999, 33f).

[5] Bradley does, I believe, have an argument from how propositional thought, or judgment, can be either true or false to his monism (see my 1998, especially §3); however, because he is concerned with dismantling the "stereotypical picture" of the Russell/Bradley dispute, Candlish does not focus on this argument (see 205, note 39).

[6] Something Russell had already claimed in (1918, 182): "A relation can never occur except as a relation, never as a subject."

[7] Thus, Russell writes of the first section of his 1919, "The Structure of Facts", that it "contains nothing essentially novel" (1919, 278, footnote).

[8] It may be relevant here to distinguish the view that concepts and relations are essentially "unsaturated" -- which requires that relations never occur in isolation from other entities -- from the view that they are "particularized" (or are "tropes") -- according to which a relation is so dependent on the terms it relates that if aRb, then that same R cannot relate different terms c and d. In PoM (§55) Russell rejects the view that relations are "particularized" and remarks later that doing so "represents an essential disagreement with Hegelians, and is necessary to the legitimacy of analysis" (1944b, 684). If Bradley held not only that relations are "unsaturated" but further that they are "particularized", he would be taking relations to be "dependent" on their terms in a stronger sense than do those who hold merely that relations are "unsaturated", in which case it would not be surprising that he draws more extreme conclusions than they do.

[9] In fact, Candlish suggests (170) that Russell is still vulnerable to Bradley's argument as late as his 1918 lectures, "The Philosophy of Logical Atomism"; however, since by then Russell has rejected the view that relations can function "as subjects" (see note 7 above), it seems that, by his own interpretation of Bradley's argument, Candlish should not make that claim.

[10] Because he interprets Bradley as arguing against the view that relations are "substances", Candlish (169-70) takes Russell's PoM (§49) comment that concepts (including relations) are just as "substantial" and "self-subsistent" as things as establishing that Russell is an appropriate target of Bradley's argument. However, Candlish also recognizes that substance is a "polymorphous notion" (130), with different philosophers identifying different features as constitutive of what it is to be a substance; hence, it would seem, he should not assume that, taken by itself, that remark shows that Russell is treating relations as "substantial" in the way that Bradley is arguing against. In fact, all that Russell is indicating is that, like things, relations are capable of functioning as "logical subjects" (see also §47), not that they are in principle incapable of playing a connective role; but, as Candlish presents it, Bradley's argument is directed against the view that relations are intrinsically "saturated". By 1911, when he still holds that relations and predicates are capable of a "twofold use", Russell claims that "particulars have the purely logical properties of substances" because they "can only be either the subjects of predicates or the terms of relations" (1911, 135). Here he indicates, in effect, that to have "the purely logical properties of substances" is to be intrinsically "saturated"; but he indicates as well that, by that standard, predicates and relations are not substances.

[11] See previous note.

[12] See in this connection Johnston (2007).