The Sacrality of the Secular: Postmodern Philosophy of Religion

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Bradley B. Onishi, The Sacrality of the Secular: Postmodern Philosophy of Religion, Columbia University Press, 2018, 263pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231183925.

Reviewed by Anthony D. Traylor, Assumption College


Bradley B. Onishi's book raises the question whether the secular harbors traces of the sacred despite having turned its back on traditional religion. He answers in the affirmative, mainly by exploring two seminal twentieth century continental thinkers, Martin Heidegger and Georges Bataille, against the backdrop of Max Weber's claim that the modern world has been demystified by calculative reason and empirical science, leaving us bereft of anything like meaning and mystery. When everything is mapped out according to the dictates of reason, there seems to be little room for the unpredictable, unexpected, or uncontrollable, what traditionally was thought of as having its provenance in the supernatural. We are seemingly left then with the following choice: resign ourselves to this predictable yet existentially shallow world of ours; or turn the clock back and reembrace our religious past. Onishi points to a way out of this dilemma by arguing that meaning and mystery can be found in the world absent of God and the scaffolding of traditional religion. This becomes clear once we reexamine the beginnings of continental philosophy and its engagement with religious texts, something that long antedates the contemporary interest in how figures like Derrida have opened up new avenues for rethinking the category of the religious.

The standard interpretation of the secular, or what Onishi calls "the secularization thesis", is that our world has undergone a steep decline in religious belief by way of its privatization and marginalization from the public square. Yet, this is precisely what secularist theorists wanted after all, namely, a world purged of superstition, the irrational, and heteronomous forms of authority. Hardcore secularism, however, peddles its own variety of fundamentalism by way of propping up the rational ego as a bulwark against the intrusion of forces that are unpredictable and unmasterable. But is this picture of an autonomous rational ego really sustainable in the end? May not the self along with its world be more enigmatic and resistant to control than secularists envision? Is there a way out of the Weberian "iron cage"?

Onishi asks a second question that parallels the first: What does the question concerning secularity have to do with the contemporary study of religion? Are not contemporary continental scholars simply closet theologians, in the business of defending or reinterpreting the religious tradition? If so, it seems that we are faced again with the choice of reverting back to religion (in some revised form or another) or doggedly sticking with the modern project of secularization. Onishi rejects this dichotomy by arguing that taking an interest in religion does not necessarily entail a return to religion itself but a chance for re-envisioning the secular as something sacred. In short, Weber's iron cage is not the only option for non-religious denizens of the modern world.

Onishi takes to heart what Thomas Carlson calls the "apophatic analogy." Drawing on Heidegger's analysis of death in Being and Time as the "possibility of one's own impossibility," Carlson links this up with the mystical tradition of the "via negativia" or the negative way to come to know God. Just as Dasein's end is something incomprehensible and beyond articulation, so is the mystic's experience of God. So, perhaps we should capitalize on the "resonances" between the traditions of phenomenology and mysticism in order to forge new pathways to reinterpreting the secular as in principle open to what we once called the sacred. But in what sense is the secular "sacred"? And, more concretely, how do Heidegger and Bataille, and other continental thinkers who follow in their wake contribute to this reconfiguration of the secular as standing for something other than Weberian disenchantment?

Onishi begins with Heidegger's attempt to rediscover meaning in a world where presumably meaning and mystery have languished in the aftermath of the positivist project of reducing life to something that can be fully mastered by calculative reason. Meaning or value is viewed now as merely subjective, or, as the Neo-Kantians would put it, "irreal" when measured against scientific knowledge of the natural world. While Weber cynically concludes that the Neo-Kantian rift between "value" and "fact" can never be successfully mended (the inevitable outcome being disenchantment), the early Heidegger embarks on an entirely different course by way of a phenomenological search for meaning embedded in the world prior to the split between "transcendental value" and "empirical reality." On Onishi's reading, the young Heidegger navigates a course between Weberian disenchantment and anti-modern nostalgia. More specifically, Heidegger's breakthrough discovery (beginning with the summer lecture course in 1919) is that all Neo-Kantian talk of "value" (the stuff of "worldviews") presupposes a more original encounter with the world which is prior to its theoretical articulation by both science and philosophy. Understood pre-theoretically, meaning is something that arises immediately out of lived-experience (Erlebnis) and takes hold of me directly. This recovery of pre-objectified experience (what Heidegger calls the "es weltet" or the "it worlds") before it has undergone a process of "de-vivification" (Ent-lebnis) marks, for Heidegger, the critical juncture not only for the fate of meaning but for the future of philosophy itself if we are to avoid the "abyss" of worldly reification, or as Onishi has it, Weberian disenchantment. Insofar as the es weltet unfolds within the temporal flow of "factical life," it resists reduction to rational mastery and reveals a certain "uncanniness" or layer of mystery that situates worldly meaning in close proximity to what we normally think of as the "sacred."

According to Onishi, Heidegger's breakthrough is further developed in his lecture courses in the early twenties, and it is precisely here that we find the so-called "apophantic analogy" at work, trading on the parallel between the uncanniness and unmasterability of factical life and the Christian experience of the Divine. Heidegger's analyses draw primarily on Paul and Augustine. In the case of Paul, what we find is a factical alternative to an objectivized notion of history espoused by the Neo-Kantians, whereby history is not a theoretical object of cognition, but rather the "enactment" (Vollzug) of factical life immersed and temporally dispersed in the concreteness of the "situation," one, moreover, where the newly converted Christian is without any solid footing and "anticipates" the Parousia in a mode of apprehensive uncertainty. Time, or rather temporality, is not a sequence of "nows" (Heidegger's critique of Aristotle), but the temporal stretch experienced by the factical self as it anticipates its future and carries along its past. Insofar as its past and future are shrouded in obscurity, Dasein's being is a "nullity" incapable of self-grounding and hence, contrary to Weber, anything that could succumb to eventual mastery.

Heidegger's analysis of Augustine in Book X of the Confessions further underscores this destabilizing of the self. Unlike the transcendental ego, Augustine's self is shot through with insecurity, fractured by mortal temporality, essentially "incurable," and always comes up short in its quest for itself in relation to God. The lesson Heidegger takes away from Augustine is the inability of Dasein to rationally master both itself and its world, something that for Onishi makes Heidegger a viable alternative to Weberian disenchantment: With the help of Paul and Augustine, Heidegger thus manages to restore both mystery and meaning to the world without, however, signing onto a religious worldview. Otherwise put, meaning is only meaningful if and when meaning "matters." If meaning does not remain open-ended and resistant to the "programmable," meaning becomes "meaningless," not in the sense that it is rendered unintelligible, but in the sense that it loses its "charge," the kind of which is supplied by Dasein's care structure as finite and death-bound. Without this existential undercurrent, meaning is cut adrift and loses its salt. Traditional religion once provided that salt. Onishi's argument throughout his work is that the secular itself contains enough resources to sustain both the meaning and mystery that Weber's disenchanted world has seemingly irrevocably cast aside.

Now for Onishi's treatment of Bataille. According to Onishi, Bataille's thought is best thought of as situated among a host of interwar French thinkers who at first enthusiastically appropriated Heidegger as an alternative to the prevailing French variant of Neo-Kantianism, but in various ways eventually sought to press beyond what they saw as the limits imposed by Heidegger's ontology. Though Onishi's account could be clearer here, Bataille supposedly faults Heidegger for failing to extricate Dasein from the orbit of its worldly possibilities and concern for the future, and complains that seizing upon its ownmost possibility of death only serves to further entrench these possibilities, in effect, setting the stage for Dasein's mastery of both itself and the world. In this respect, Dasein never escapes the field of usefulness and production, or what Bataille calls "homogeneity." What is needed, then, is a clean break with the homogenous via an encounter with alterity, the sort provided by religious sacrifice, festival, and eroticism which temporarily suspend concern for the future and expose us to the "heterogeneous" realm of the "immediate" and purely "useless." It is on the issue of death, however, where Heidegger and Bataille mostly differ. Whereas Heidegger sees death and its anticipation as the way for Dasein to authentically shore up its worldly possibilities, Bataille discerns in death (more accurately, experiences which approximate it) a violent rupturing of the boundaries enclosing the self within its "discontinuous" skin. Thus, for Bataille, death constitutes a limit experience, one uniquely capable of reacquainting the self with its "lost continuity," another name for the sacred.

Onishi deepens his account of Bataille by turning to his major work in the 1940s, The Accursed Share, in which Bataille develops the notion of economy based not on production but excess and non-productive expenditure. Through work, humanity enters the profane world of useful production and becomes subservient to the project of survival. Weighed down by utility, the need for a "sovereign" moment arises wherein concern for oneself and the future are temporarily negated in favor of the immediacy of the present. Sovereign moments entail "self-dispossession" and are akin to death. Bataille's "thanatology" is therefore incompatible with Christian faith which offers a "narcotic" in the face of death by way of promising eternal salvation. Following Maurice Blanchot, experience itself, for Bataille, becomes authoritative when it confronts the indigestible fact of death minus any divine support. Thanatology is thus "atheology." Indeed, this is the deep truth underlying the death on the cross and the lamma sabachtani. Drawing on mystics like John of the Cross and Angela of Foligno, Bataille adopts the imperative to empty himself of the pretention to "want to be everything" and "live forever." According to Bataille, this is exactly what Christ experiences on the cross, namely, complete abandonment in the face of his own imminent demise. In an act of communion, both God and man slip into infinite night and are dispossessed of their selfhood. In place of Christian mysticism, Bataille offers us a secular mysticism, an experience of the sacred light years away from any hope of redemption, and, importantly for Onishi, another example of how continental philosophy can sacralize the secular and avoid Weberian disenchantment.

Onishi concludes with a brief overview of three of the foremost contemporary Anglophone continental philosophers working in the area of religion: Kevin Hart, John Caputo, and Mark Taylor. On Onishi's reading, only Taylor can rightly be considered the true heir to Heidegger and Bataille. Accordingly, Onishi draws a distinction between "continental philosophical theology" which seeks to defend or reform religious belief and "continental philosophy of religion" which is interested in exploring the parallels between continental philosophy and religious phenomena. And while all three thinkers take Derrida as their point of departure, it is Taylor alone who escapes the charge of being a "crypto-theologian." In the case of Hart, deconstruction is employed as a means to purge the theological tradition of its contamination by metaphysics, in particular, the ontotheological habit of making God out to be the "highest being." With Caputo, deconstruction serves to develop a new kind of theology, namely, a "religion without religion," that is, a postmodern religiosity that retains the general messianic structure and ethical impulse of Christianity but rejects its historical determinateness. Whether these assessments are fair or not, Onishi thinks both Hart and Caputo would be more comfortable in divinity schools than departments of religion.

This leaves Taylor to carry the torch of sacralizing the secular that first begins with Heidegger and continues with Bataille; for Taylor is neither interested in purifying theology (as is Hart) nor radicalizing it (as is Caputo). Rather, Taylor's aim is to unconditionally embrace the "wound of mortal temporality" absent any metaphysical or theological assurances. It is precisely this absence of God or any other kind of "transcendental signified" that constitutes the sacred character of secular life, enchants it, and thus prevents its reduction to Weber's iron cage. Taylor's project can be accurately summed up then as a scouring through the terrain of secular life in search for those elements of uncertainty, indeterminacy, and instability that perpetually haunt human existence and impart to it a certain religious aura. For Taylor (and his followers), the secular has resources plenty enough to resist disenchantment.

Onishi's book is clearly written, offers a thoughtful introduction to the field of continental philosophy of religion, and lays out a coherent case for why the secular can be sacred on its own terms. But I have three questions. First, why the need for the "apophantic analogy" if secularity in its attempt to redeem itself can for all practical purposes dispense with traditional religion? Would it not, in principle, be possible for thinkers like Heidegger, Bataille, and Taylor to arrive at their insights regarding the mysterious or meaningful character of secular experience without having to draw on religious figures or categories to give their claims credence? Second, is there not more to the experience of the sacred than simply acknowledging that life and the world are unpredictable and incapable of being mastered by calculative reason? It seems to me that the bar has been set too low. Perhaps Hart, Caputo, and other thinkers who are similarly theologically inclined could offer insight into whether there is more to the notion of the sacred than Onishi suggests. Undoubtedly, resistance to Weber's iron cage is a minimal requirement. But what about a sense of reverence toward the holy or the outlandish hope that all will turn out well in the end? Lastly, the fact that the modern world has been secularized seems to be well-nigh irreversible. Philosophy is and always has been an esoteric business, the prerogative of elites. Very few are ever going to read or be able to understand Heidegger, Bataille, or Taylor, or for that matter take any real interest in continental philosophy of religion. No matter how crude or backward, traditional religion afforded virtually everyone access to the sacred. Philosophical attempts at reviving the sacred in a post-sacral age for these reasons appear to be fighting an uphill battle.


Bataille, Georges. (1991). The Accursed Share. Vol. I. Tr. Robert Hurley (New York: Zone Books).

Bataille, Georges. (1998). On Nietzsche. Tr. Bruce Boone (Saint Paul, MN: Paragon House Publishers).

Carlson, Thomas. (1999). Indiscretion: Finitude and the Naming of God (Chicago: University of Chicago Press).

Heidegger, Martin. (1962). Being and Time. Tr. Edward Robinson and John Macquarrie (Oxford: Blackwell).

Heidegger, Martin. (2008). Towards the Definition of Philosophy. Tr. Ted Sadler (New York: Continuum).

Heidegger, Martin. (2010). The Phenomenology of Religious Life. Tr. Matthias Frisch and Jennifer Anna Gosetti-Ferencei (Bloomington: Indiana University Press).