The Science, Politics, and Ontology of Life-Philosophy

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Scott M. Campbell and Paul W. Bruno, The Science, Politics, and Ontology of Life-Philosophy, Bloomsbury, 2013, 267pp., $37.95 (pbk), 9781472591586.

Reviewed by Keith Ansell-Pearson, University of Warwick


In their Introduction the editors state that they wish this book to help restore life to a fundamental place within philosophical discourse and practice. It is an ambitious collection of essays of mixed quality that aims to retrieve and extend the work of the classical philosophers of life, notably Nietzsche, Dilthey, and Bergson. In large part, the volume succeeds in the tasks it has set itself, and it deserves to stimulate wide-ranging debates on the category of life as it concerns matters of ontology, science, and politics. If I have one major criticism it is that the essays do not sufficiently engage with one another, and as a result one is left with a series of largely juxtaposed sections. Having said this, however, there is plenty of material in this book to stimulate the mind and to provoke thought.

The volume is divided into four main parts with a total of eighteen essays. In the first part we have essays on Dilthey, Heidegger, Nietzsche, and Bergson. The opening essay by Rudolf A. Makkreel helpfully examines the philosophy of life articulated in the work of Dilthey, making the key point that the philosophy of life is not reductive in any biological sense. Dilthey is concerned with articulating the specific character of the inquiry of the human sciences and insists that these sciences cannot be simply patterned on the law-based model of the human sciences. Makkreel deftly and instructively explores what it means to hold, as Dilthey did, that life is the ultimate context of interpretive critique: it frames the mechanical causality of physics and aims to encompass so-called 'vital' forces and processes. Although the author does not note it, it could be argued that this has been the ambition of reflection on life ever since the beginnings of philosophy; for example, it is surely the ambit of Lucretius's De Rerum Natura. Makkreel argues that life cannot be defined by contrast to anything since it constitutes 'the overall givenness of things' (pp. 3-4). Here the given is not a simple fact in the positivist sense, but rather 'the unfathomable source and context of all experience' (p. 4). Furthermore, this approach to life is able to reflect on the biological conditions of human life whilst at the same time accounting for the transcendental conditions for understanding its significance. The task is to allow into one's conception of life both biological agency and transcendental spontaneity. The essay provides an excellent opening and serves to clarify some key features of the philosophy of life.

Eric S. Nelson's essay on biological and historical life explores Heidegger 'between Levinas and Dilthey'. It is a welcome and helpful appreciation of Heidegger's relation to naturalism and to questions of life. As Nelson correctly notes at the start, phenomenology has had an uneasy relationship with the categories of nature and life, and with biology in general, since it locates in them reductionist dangers. However, as he also rightly notes, the work of Heidegger is marked, at least in part, by the repeated attempt to think the notion of 'life', and also that of nature as physis. Nelson skillfully negotiates the complexities and nuances of Heidegger's thinking and succinctly shows the points at which he distances himself from any biologistic interpretation of life, be it within life-philosophy, within vitalism, or within social Darwinism: 'Life is not only given as stability, security, and certainty but exposed as dispersal, distance, and ruination' (p. 26).

In a wide-ranging and at times loosely argued essay, Ronnie Hawkins focuses on Nietzsche's critique of both mechanism and Platonism as a way of exploring what it means to have a 'vital' relation to the biosphere. Along the way she makes connections with complexity theory, for example, the work of Stuart Kauffman, and ultimately shows that Nietzsche's conception of the world, of life, is thoroughly Lucretian: 'His alternative vision was one of turbulence, peopled by myriad living forms, transient and yet eternally recurring, disparate yet somehow united in joyful oneness' (p. 33). Although she writes as a non-specialist on Nietzsche's work, her essay contains an instructive engagement with a cryptic note in his Nachlass, in which he writes that the two most extreme modes of thought, namely, the mechanistic and the Platonic, are reconciled as ideals in the thought of eternal recurrence.

The fourth and final contribution in this opening section is a masterful essay by Florence Caeymaex (translated from the French by Edward McGushin) on Bergson and life. Of all the philosophers of life under consideration in this volume Bergson is perhaps the most dexterous and certainly the one most informed by, and knowledgeable of, the scientific advances of his day. He seeks a close rapport between biology and philosophy, though ultimately his overriding aim in his classic, if now neglected, text of 1907, Creative Evolution, is to show the need for a fundamental reform of philosophy so that it learns how to think beyond the human condition, that is, outside the frame of our evolved and dominant habits of representation, especially spatial ones. As Caeymaex argues, it is intellectual laziness to apply the label of 'vitalism' to Bergson's project since he never appeals to a vital principle at the core of reality. Indeed, she goes so far as to provocatively claim that Bergson, 'never advanced "life" or "vitalism" as the ultimate, unique, or all-encompassing explanatory principle' (p. 48). In short, life is far too intricate and complicated for us to be able to develop the whole of knowledge within any single principle.

This essay is deftly executed and serves to show the sheer brilliance of Bergson's text on creative evolution, a text that merits being the subject of widespread appreciation and close study amongst philosophers today. The opening part of the volume features essays that contain fertile ideas for thinking about life in fresh and innovative ways, and though the attention devoted to the likes of Nietzsche, Dilthey, Bergson, and Heidegger makes sense, an opportunity to renew the tradition by covering neglected and forgotten modern philosophers of life, such as Jean-Marie Guyau (1854-88) and his exemplary work, has been missed.

Part Two is on 'Converging Technologies' and features a further four essays. The opening essay by, H. Peter Steeves, features a wide-ranging meditation on 'Information, Self-reference, and the Magical Realism of "Life"' that is often poetic and lyrical, as well as philosophically informed and directed. Perhaps the key question the essay raises, and then explores in an innovative manner, is that concerning teleology: what is lost when this notion is jettisoned? As Steeves provocatively puts it, although the universe did not mean to create life, when we jettison all talk of purpose and destination we neglect the possibility that the definition of 'life' may best be had by looking at what it does rather than what it is (p. 68).

Jean-Pierre Dupuy next considers the artificialization of life in an essay that reflects on 'designing self-organization'. As he puts it at the very start, our capacity to act is not limited to the human sphere and involves tampering with complex natural phenomena: we now act 'into' nature, as Arendt put it memorably in The Human Condition. According to Dupuy this now means for us living with uncertainty in an age of life's increasing 'artificialization', and his essay is a consideration of the ethics of prudence that needs to accompany such a new age. To a certain extent he is taking up the challenge put to ethics by the new technology in the works of Hans Jonas, such as The Imperative of Responsibility. He shares Jonas's credo that there is no ethics without metaphysics, and the effort needs to be made, he argues, to show that the most important ethical issues raised by converging technologies (NBIC) can only be worked through by coming to terms with the metaphysical assumptions informing the field.

He challenges the Heideggerean view that holds technoscience, including cybernetics, to be the culmination of Western metaphysics and a science of calculation and control. For Dupuy, by contrast, the notions of design and control do not belong together: 'The new metaphysics associates design and out-of-controlness, a marriage that Heidegger could never envisage' (p. 90). In part, Dupuy takes his inspiration from the work of Kevin Kelly, and for me this makes his contribution more than a little dubious. Kelly has famously argued that evolution has found ways of speeding itself up in the new biology of machines and that speed is the circuit on which the evolution of life runs: one could not find a more dubious apologia for late-modern capitalism and its subjugation of the planet by an alleged logic of 'out of control'.

In his contribution on biology and technology Jos de Mul looks at the synthesis between biology and computer science, including the digitalization of biology (such as the attempt to sequence and decipher the human genome), which is especially evident in the world of molecular biology where we see DNA research moving from the analogical world of biology to the digital world of the computer. At the same time we observe computer scientists getting increasingly interested in modes of biology, an interest evident in the research carried out since the 1950s in artificial life and intelligence. Mul wants to reflect on these developments, especially informationistic biotechnologies, and consider the advantages and disadvantages of 'biotech' for life. Again, like Dupuy, there is some science-fiction speculation about a biotech world 'out of control', in which the hope is expressed that the future biological engines will not domesticate us humans.

This section ends with an essay by Charles Bonner reflecting on the philosophy of life in an information age. His is a highly intelligent and serious meditation on some core questions about life now, especially as they concern philosophy and questions of meaning. As he notes, 'life itself has emerged at the center of a new problematic distinctive of late twentieth century' (p. 110). Today we witness coming into existence tremendous new powers over life, involving unprecedented capacities for manipulating life, and yet, Bonner contends, these new powers and capacities 'do not coincide with a deeper understanding or appreciation of human life, as our technological advances are not informed or directed by any set of human values based on a meaningful conception of life' (pp. 110-11). Drawing on the ideas of Foucault (on biopower and subjectivization) and of Heidegger (on the history of being), Bonner seeks to develop an 'ontology of ourselves' that reflects on subjectivity in the age of information, including a concern with an ethico-political care of the self. With its philosophical thoughtfulness the essay brings this particular part of the book, which had not reflected rigorously enough on questions of control and mastery, to a satisfying close.

Part Three centres on 'Life, Power, and Politics' and features three essays. The first of these, by Michael J. O' Neill, is on Nietzsche, pluralism, and the problem of the unity of human experience. Although it seems to be only loosely connected to the ambit of the volume, and sits oddly beside the previous section, this is an interesting essay on how to read Nietzsche as, of all things, a political thinker. For O' Neill, Nietzsche's comments on politics are best related to this thinking about culture, in which a good or authentic politics is one that serves the advancement of culture. The essay contains a set of reflections on Nietzsche's agonism versus the agnosticism of liberal democracy, in which Nietzsche is said to regard the value of 'objectivity' as pernicious. This is true to a large extent, but the author fails to take into account Nietzsche's attempts to refashion objectivity through his theory of affects (e.g., the more 'eyes' with which we see the greater will be our 'objectivity'), which is something he does in the 1886 preface to Human, All Too Human and in the third essay of On the Genealogy of Morality.

In a wide-ranging essay on 'Anachronism and Powerlessness' Leonard Lawlor reflects on the relationship between postmodernism and the philosophy of life, and stages a series of intriguing encounters with the ideas of Lyotard, Deleuze, and Bergsonism. In particular, he wishes to pursue an inquiry into the problematization of immanence and contends that any and all anti-Platonistic thought, be it phenomenology's or Deleuze's, is immanentist. The idea is somewhat elliptically developed by Lawlor, though readers of Deleuze will immediately recognize immanence as perhaps the leitmotif of his work, or much of it. For Lawlor immanentist thought is political, and of relevance to a thinking of life, because of its commitment to difference and heterogeneity: 'The primary consequence of immanence therefore is heterogeneity' (p. 143). Not only is there no transcendent measure for discourses, there is also no identity that can be said to be constitutive of the self: 'Instead of identity, I find, inside of myself, difference', and in which 'I' is an other (p. 143). The political problem par excellence of postmodern thought -- and here we see the influence of Lyotard on Lawlor's concerns in this essay -- is with the constitution of a nontotalitarian 'we'. Lawlor's interest is in a future people or a people to come, and he pursues this concern in a way that is highly engaging and deeply instructive.

Again, though, I was left wondering, as with the previous essay, just how it fits into the questions about bio-technology and bio-power that the volume is purportedly concerned with. It's only with the next essay that these concerns become explicitly addressed and a synthesis is attempted. This is the essay by Serena Parekh on liberal eugenics, autonomy, and bio-power. The essay is written in a highly lucid style and contains a helpful series of insights into the peculiar character of liberal eugenics, where questions of autonomy and of bio-power are central. Here 'liberal eugenics' refers to (genetic) technologies that are not designed to improve health or to fight disease but rather simply to augment the lives of ordinary, healthy individuals; it is 'liberal' because no state coercion is involved and individuals are 'free' to choose or refrain from choosing certain enhancements for themselves or for their children. Parekh's approach is novel and politically astute in that it recognizes the need to approach liberal eugenics as a form of biopolitical and disciplinary technology, and it is this that allows us to call into question the so-called 'free' choices made by supposedly autonomous individuals.

The fourth and final section is entitled 'Philosophies of Life' and is the longest section with seven contributions, from Edward McGushin on Foucault and Derrida on learning how to live; Scott M. Campbell on the tragic sense of life in Heidegger on Antigone; Stephen R. L. Clark on how to live in a Pyrrhonian way; Neil Turnbull on Wittgenstein and philosophy's turn to life; Paul W. Bruno on life and desire in Kant, Richard Lewontin, and René Girard; an essay by Jason J. Howard on the wisdom of the emotions; and finally yet another essay on Nietzsche, this time one on history and genealogy by Allison M. Merrick. For reasons of space I shall select just the first one for comment.

In an essay on the care of the self and the gift of death, McGushin explores how the divergent conceptions of the care of the self found in Derrida and Foucault can intersect and be made relevant today, making of it a renewed task. In the case of Foucault the issues centre on the self's relationship to itself defined by freedom and truth, whereas in Derrida's case there is a gift of responsibility before the other. The context in which the care of the self can be made relevant is partly illuminated by McGushin with reference to the work of Jan Patočka and partly with reference to Foucault's extraordinary work on bio-power, in which it is recognized that what calls for care of the self today, and yet simultaneously disables such care, is the multiplication, extension, and intensification of power. McGushin is a fine writer and philosopher, and he pursues his inquiry into Foucault and Derrida in highly lucid and illuminating terms.

However, he could have recognized that a concern with the care of the self contra the disciplinary technologies of modern commercial society is something that goes back to Nietzsche, especially in the middle period texts, such as Dawn (1881). Far from being an arcane exercise, the practice of the care of the self is a powerful way of mounting an ethics of resistance contra the bio-political tendencies of our modernity. Of course, McGushin is right when at the end of his essay he acknowledges the need for the practice of the care of the self to give rise to, and be linked with, a political ethos. We can no longer hold onto, as Nietzsche does in his middle period, to the fantasy of cultivating our Epicurean gardens.

The editors have put together a highly stimulating collection. There a number of strong essays,  and the book will appeal to those working across the disciplines in philosophy, political theory, sociology, and cultural studies and with an interest in the notion of 'life', especially as it is now being played out in contemporary intellectual discourses. The editors are correct in their belief that the notion of life needs to address and provoke thought in the domains of science, politics, and ontology.