The Secular Outlook: In Defense of Moral and Political Secularism

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Paul Cliteur, The Secular Outlook: In Defense of Moral and Political Secularism, Wiley-Blackwell, 2010, 317pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781444335217.

Reviewed by J. Caleb Clanton, Pepperdine University


The primary goal of this book, its author says, is "to show how religious believers and unbelievers can live peacefully together and what principles the state should try to stimulate in its citizenry to achieve social harmony and social cohesion" (1). Cliteur thinks we need this instruction because of the growing global threat of religiously inspired injustice, coercion, violence, and terrorism. As an antidote, he recommends a moral and political vision which he calls "a 'secular outlook' on life" (1). Its four main components are atheism, criticism of religion, free speech, and "moral autonomy" (11). Cliteur discusses these respectively in the book's four chapters.

The first chapter sets out to explain what atheism is. Cliteur says atheism shouldn't be understood as a set of positive assertions, and neither should it be understood as a religion in its own right (16). An atheist needn't necessarily believe that God does not exist; rather, atheism is simply a-theism, meaning that the atheist simply doesn't affirm that there exists a personal, transcendent, omniscient, omnipotent, and omnibenevolent being traditionally called "God" (16-17; cf. 35). This definition of atheism, Cliteur admits, has some counterintuitive implications (27). For example, polytheists and pantheists are rightly labeled as atheist insofar as they don't affirm that there's a big-g God, but only little-g gods. The same goes for squishy, liberal theologians who assert that the divine is merely some vague and vacuous "other" or something similar to what Paul Tillich calls "ultimate concern": they're really atheists, too (29). Following Antony Flew, Cliteur maintains that atheism understood merely as a "negative doctrine" doesn't have the burden of proof because it isn't making any positive assertions (38). So when theists demand that atheists pony up and defend their atheism, they're really just confusing the status of not believing in God's existence (negative atheism) with the view that God doesn't exist (positive atheism). And negative atheism should be regarded as "the default position," Cliteur asserts (39). He adds to this that only those who have come to hold their view through "an explicit intellectual choice" should be regarded as atheists (39).

Atheism, for Cliteur, should only be taken as a "private" matter, meaning that the atheist needn't say that "all people have to subscribe to his or her view of life in order to live peacefully together" or that the state should squelch religion (66, 68). Yet Cliteur also thinks that private atheism is "an integral part of the secular outlook" (66). Because the word "atheism" is often associated with "public atheism" or "political atheism," he ultimately recommends that secularists replace the term with "non-theism" (68). Cliteur takes a troubled tone at the end of the chapter when he says that atheists have "lost the debate when it comes to public perception," even though they've "won the intellectual battle" (68). Why is it clear to him that atheism (qua non-theism) is the intellectual victor? It's natural to be curious about this in light of certain formidable work that theists have produced lately in the philosophy of religion. Disappointingly, Cliteur doesn't explain why he's so confident -- though in asserting that atheism is the proper default position, he makes mention of his favorite atheist writers.

In the second chapter, Cliteur discusses criticism of religion -- a sort of criticism that he takes to be the first of the two great "pillars of freethought" (71). His main point is that "only if religion is subjected to rigorous criticism can it be purified" of its darker impulses (74). All too often, Cliteur says, advocates of religion as well as scholars manifest a "pussyfooting attitude" when it comes to dealing with certain passages in religious holy books that seem to breed terrorism, violence, and injustice: typically, they either just turn a blind eye to them, or they attempt to explain them all away by some fancy interpretative acrobatics, or they just punt by blaming anything negative on something external to religion itself (80). But Cliteur wants us to be freethinkers and to expose the ways in which sacred texts actually endorse or even encourage violence, terrorism, and injustice. As an example, he points to the Qur'an's mandate of flogging as punishment for adultery (Sura 24:2). That passage seems to have influenced the Saudi legal system in recently sentencing a victim of gang rape to 200 lashes (85). Cliteur criticizes Islamic moderates like Tariq Ramadan for not speaking out loudly enough against such an unjust sentence and for "obfuscating the relationship between the passage in the holy book and the social practice" when they claim that the source of the problem is really one of improper interpretation and application, rather than the Qur'an or Islam itself (85; cf. 87).

Cliteur thinks that blaming misinterpretation as a way of vindicating religious holy books is just a cop out and that such a maneuver ultimately leads to some sort of "postmodern" textual relativism according to which we can just read the text in any way we like (92). Ultimately, he says, there's just no way around the fact that the "problem is the text itself" (97). And there are similar problems with the Old Testament, especially insofar as it seems to Cliteur to imply that we should kill apostates (Deuteronomy 13:6-12) and it has Yahweh praise Phineas (Numbers 25:1-18), who is "the archetypical religious terrorist" (107). Cliteur has a harder time finding inflammatory commands in the New Testament, though he tries to read Matthew 5:30 (where Jesus says to poke out your eye if it causes you to stumble into adultery) as telling Christians to cast out heretics when they threaten to drag society into hell (110). As Cliteur sees it, we really have only two options: either we own up to the violence-endorsing nature of these holy books, or we resign ourselves to relativism if we try to offer better interpretations of the passages he finds most disturbing. The most obvious concern here is that Cliteur seems to want to force us into a false dilemma that will likely breed more religious fundamentalism, not less. And it appears that Cliteur wants to prevent religious folks from taking the same interpretative and contextualizing liberties he's clearly willing to allow himself.

Cliteur turns his attention in Chapter 3 to discussing his hope that combining religious criticism with the freedom of expression can help us find truth and emancipate us from the evils of religion. He admits (following Mill) that there are some legitimate limits to the freedom of expression -- for example, when a speech act poses a "clear and present danger" and hence threatens harm to others, it shouldn't be protected. Ayatollah Khomeini's fatwa on Salman Rushdie is a prime example (125-30; cf. 134-137). But in the aftermath of the Rushdie affair and the Danish cartoon affair, Cliteur says, many politicians, thinkers, and advocates of multiculturalism have toed a dangerous line in wanting to limit the expression of those whose criticism of religion offends religious communities; they're particularly quick to reprimand religious critics in cases where criticism seems to spark violence (as in the case involving the cartoon depictions of Mohammed). A particularly problematic example of this line-toeing, according to Cliteur, is the "deeply misguided" non-binding resolution on "defamation of religion" adopted in 2009 by the Human Rights Council of the UN (162). Cliteur warns that moves of this sort are dangerous because they seek to remove religion from the scope of criticism and hence accountability. And he warns that pulling the critical punch in cases where it is merely religiously offensive could have the result that "nothing could be said or published if there were people prepared to use violence against the writer" (137). Instead, Cliteur argues, we should seek to protect the right to criticize, instead of acting as if one has a right not to be criticized (139).

Cliteur is right, of course, that free inquiry and criticism should be protected. Yet while we should protect the right to criticize religions, aren't there better and worse sorts of criticism? Sometimes criticism undertaken in the wrong manner can undermine the background conditions for the robust and effective exchange of argument and criticism over time -- the very sort Cliteur himself hopes to engender. Criticism for the sake of criticism doesn't amount to much; those whose religious views are the focus of criticism need to hear it. And that may mean that it would be advantageous for critics to practice certain deliberative virtues, even though there shouldn't be any legal obligation to have them.

In the fourth and final chapter, Cliteur paints his secular outlook as one that seeks to be morally autonomous in the sense that it attempts to "justify moral ideals without reference to religion" (173; cf. 220n166). This puts his secular outlook at odds with the metaethical assumptions of the Abrahamic traditions to the extent that they all assume divine command theory (DCT) to be true (189). Cliteur thinks there are numerous problems with DCT. And while he notes that there are actually some smart people who attempt to defend DCT against the sort of objections he offers (thinkers like Philip Quinn, Richard Mouw, Robert Adams, and Linda Zagzebski), Cliteur doesn't engage their views, "because that is not necessary for this project" (233-4). The chief problem with DCT, Cliteur says, is that assuming it to be true -- in combination with what he takes to be some pretty heinous divine commands and endorsements -- provides the "perfect basis for religious terrorism" (215). Cliteur discusses the Abraham and Isaac story in Genesis 22, the story of Jephtha in Judges 29, and Sura 2:216 as examples of particularly dangerous divine commands (194-201, 201-4, 216). If someone takes these would-be divine commands to be normative, then we're really up a creek. So we need to nip the problem in the bud by urging people to reject not only scriptural authority but also DCT (210, 266). In a nutshell: "Religious terrorists operate on the basis of divine command ethics, so there is a public interest involved in having a more autonomously educated citizenry" (234).

Cliteur seems to overreach in saying that in order to end terrorism, we need to teach citizens to reject DCT. Contrary to what Cliteur wants to suggest, there may be serious reasons to think that the real danger isn't DCT or the sacred texts but certain misinterpretations and misuses of these texts, not the sacred texts themselves. When religious terrorists take their holy books to say that God or Allah commands them to engage in terrorism, perhaps the problem is just that they've misread their holy books. Education and inquiry probably are quite important, as Cliteur wants to say; but they may need to start with certain questions that he shies away from -- questions such as: What does the text really say? What's the broader context in which it's said? To whom is it addressed? Is the text intended as history, parable, an allegory, or poetry? What's the proper application of the story in the text? Answering these sorts of questions doesn't entail that interpreters are relativists or that they're "violating the integrity of the text" (262). And when religions need to be criticized, as they often do, what they need most may be what Jeffrey Stout calls "immanent criticism."[1] If one wonders whether better interpretative practices can do the trick, it makes sense to consider cases where immanent criticism has actually been employed. One such example might be Judge Hamoud al-Hitar's reported success in debating more than 350 captured Al Qaeda members in Yemen. His strategy has been to challenge these potential terrorists to a theological debate of sorts with him and a panel of Islamic theologians: "If you can convince us that your ideas are justified by the Koran, then we will join you in your struggle … But if we succeed in convincing you of our ideas, then you must agree to renounce violence."[2] There's some indication that Hitar and his team of Islamic theologians have been successful in keeping these potential terrorists from engaging in future acts of violence, and -- importantly -- not by getting them to reject DCT but by getting them to think about how to interpret what they take to be God's written word in the first place.

Still, Cliteur worries that, no matter how much interpretative and theological hot-air one blows at some holy book passages, some apparent divine commands are still just heinous, and "it is dangerously naïve to say that the problem with radical youngsters is that they are mistaken in their interpretation of Holy Scripture" (278). So, we're right back to the need to reject DCT and scriptural authority to prevent religious terrorism. But even in those situations Cliteur's reaction may be hasty: one could still make the case that, if indeed the (apparently) commanded act in question is bad, then God couldn't have commanded that particular action. For if God's commands are what makes an action right, and if the action in question is indeed wrong, then it couldn't have been issued by God. Seeing this might require one who assumes DCT and scriptural authority to reject particular passages as authoritative. But, again, that doesn't require one to scrap DCT or the holy book (or, at least, all of the holy book). Admittedly, there may be a problem in cases where certain religious fundamentalists are unwilling to read their holy book in its proper context or with any critical intelligence. But are we to believe that they'd be more likely to reject DCT than consider alternate interpretations of what they take to be the proper source of normative authority? I seriously doubt that. So one problem with Cliteur's educational proposal is that it seems pretty impractical.

Cliteur's book is an ambitious work in public philosophy insofar as it attempts to cover a slew of different issues in philosophy of religion, intellectual history, ethics, law, and politics in order to address contemporary societal ills. But as projects of this sort almost inevitably go, Cliteur's is less than satisfactory at a number of points. Throughout the book, Cliteur takes aim at religion not on the grounds that it is false (though he apparently thinks it is) but on the grounds that it is bad because it inspires violent behavior. So all in all, Cliteur is offering a pragmatist criticism of religion (though he doesn't use that language to describe his work). And his basic strategy seems to be this: point to certain holy book passages and generalize (aha!) to the violent nature of all theistic religions. Sadly, that sort of strategy is bound to have limited appeal. Those whom it would convince are probably already faithful devotees of "the secular outlook." And religious believers are likely to show Cliteur about as much sympathy as he shows them.

[1] Jeffrey Stout, Democracy and Tradition (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2004), 69-70.

[2] James Brandon, "Koranic Duels Ease Terror," Christian Science Monitor 97,50 (4 February 2005): 1.