The Self Awakened: Pragmatism Unbound

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Roberto Mangabeira Unger, The Self Awakened: Pragmatism Unbound, Harvard University Press, 2007, 277pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0674023544.

Reviewed by Martin Stone, Cardozo Law School, Yeshiva University



According to a remark of Sartre's, the project of man - that peculiar mix of self-consciousness and brute givenness  - is to become God.1  That remark captures the organizing motif of Roberto Unger's latest volume, which in fact repeats the Sartrean formula close to a dozen times.  The divinizing project is of course impossible — in Sartre's terms, this would require that the human "for itself" be also "in itself" — and Unger would not disagree.  However, we can, according to Unger, strive for something second best:  to become more "god-like."  This would be to exercise our agential capacities for innovation ("context-transcending spirit," Unger calls it) in ways which make us less subject to natural and social necessities - to the fatefulness of nature, culture and social organization.  In a word, it would be for us to be free.

Freedom, for Sartre, is what a human self-consciousness cannot fail to be, though she may employ various strategies for avoiding recognition of it.  Unger also inherits a conception of human being as freedom at its core (as befits a creature made in the image of God), but with this notable difference -  that the human being may succeed more or less at being the free being she is.  Moreover, the conditions for success are, according to Unger, essentially political.  What is required is a large-scale remaking of social organization so as to render it continuously more open to experiment and self-revision.  This in turn would develop and nurture those creative aspects of the person which are needed for bringing about such re-making (Unger suggests), while also allowing for more universal participation in such exercises of collectively organized self-invention.  The "philosophy" which fits and explains this snow-balling eruption of politically self-revising agency is, Unger says, a "radicalized pragmatism."

The themes here will be familiar to Unger's readers:  the intellectual and political implications of a view of human beings as context-transcending agents; the normative bearing of this view on politics; the primacy of the practical (the point of view of agents over that of spectators); political freedom as involving institutions which foster continuous self-revision, and as the liberation of individual and collective will from background structure; the institutional indeterminacy of abstract political values and the creative potential of local experimentation; the illusions of theoretical naturalisms; the dual nature of human being as something both part of the natural world and transcending it; the conflicting enabling conditions of selfhood (separation and community); the distance between man (as a being sunk in nature) and God; and, of course, the striving of such a dual being to be more "godlike."

The stylistic presentation of these themes in The Self Awakened is also vintage Unger:  exhortative, deeply romantic, full of moral intensity, relentlessly hopeful, marginal to professional philosophy.  The work is part essay (after Emerson or the German romantics), part sermon, part political manifesto, and part critical theory.  It is a left-romantic-existential-political Wake-Up Call.  There is an American optimism and energy about it too.  It seems more spiritually akin to Whitman or Emerson than to the "Pragmatists" it celebrates.  The romantic argument — which links a transformative social/political vision to the structure of the self conceived in terms of its practical freedom — isn't exactly new.  But it's hard to think of anyone today who develops such an argument with Unger's intellectual breadth or his concern for logical transparency.  The sound of the writing is one of Unger's signatures — the Epistle to the Romans meets the lawyer's appellate brief.  And that is no accident.  It's part of Unger's ambition to bring visionary modes of thought — those which are sometimes called prophetic or poetic — closer to the language of institutional rationality.

That Unger has done much of this before is not a complaint.  For it is only natural to expect someone with a big idea — a global reading of human experience — to dig further in the same ground.  No mistake, Unger is a philosopher of grand commonplaces — i.e., of the metaphysical or "grammatical" truisms which describe our being-in-the-world — and not of local novelties.  The present volume attempts to articulate the most abstract presuppositions — about what human agents are, and about what is involved in their thought and action - which are implicit in his previous ventures in social theory and philosophical psychology.  As such, The Self Awakened can serve as a helpful synthesizing introduction to Unger's now voluminous work.


So much for the bright and the good; now for the dull and the bad.  Some of the flaws of The Self-Awakened are unique to it; others are carry-overs of unresolved problems from Unger's previous work.<!-[if !supportFootnotes]—>2  I'll mention three difficulties, in increasing order of seriousness.

1.  Pragmatism.  The first difficulty is a new arrival.  "Philosophy" in Unger's hands means something like the most general stories we can tell ourselves about what a human being is, what it can know and hope for, and the conditions of its possible happiness.  Unger's main purpose is to explain and recommend the general doctrines which make up "radicalized pragmatism," in contrast to what he takes to be the other philosophical stories on offer in human history.  Pragmatism, according to Unger, is the best story there is, but it has been compromised by forms of scientism, the tendency to take the (no doubt impressive) methods and results of the natural sciences as the key to everything there is.  So Unger proposes to radicalize and restore the story.  Well and good:  This looks like it will engage others writing today with a stake in pragmatism.  But it only looks that way.

In fact, there is something arbitrary in the choice of "pragmatism" as the name for Unger's favored story.  The view which emerges here isn't proprietary to, say, James, Dewey or Pierce (as Unger himself acknowledges).3  You might plausibly say Unger's view is "Sartrean" (in its emphasis on self-conscious practical agency), or Hegelian (in its presentation of history as the progressive realization of freedom), or Emersonian or Nietzschean (in its portrayal of self-overcoming as the mark of the human).  It is quite generally post-Kantian, in its insistence on the distinction between Nature and Freedom, and in its depiction of human will and agency as prior to any formal requirements of natural and political order.  So why pragmatism?  Why this frame?

Partly, I suspect, because "pragmatism," among the foregoing doctrines, is the one most devoid of any obvious metaphysical or political commitments.  As recent discussions from Richard Rorty to Richard Posner and Stanley Fish make clear, "pragmatism" can be just about anything an American wants it to be. This would naturally make it serviceable for Unger's creative purposes.  True, Unger does devote some pages to discussing what James & Co. got right and wrong.  But the attempt to root "radicalized pragmatism" in historical American pragmatism seems half-hearted (as if Unger felt he needed to do something to make academics listen) and, anyway, unconvincing.  Nothing really turns here on what some New England or Midwestern academics said.  Unger also says that this label has certain programmatic advantages, owing to the fact that pragmatism "remains the most characteristic philosophy of what is today in every dimension the dominant power."4  Huh?  That must be "pragmatism" in a different sense than the academic one.  And by this logic, perhaps we would do best to take our philosophy straight from Bill Gates or the World Bank, and so on.  Granted, the United States of America, for Unger, represents the most advanced variation of the liberal political experiment he seeks to radicalize.  Still, set alongside a discussion of the errors of James & Co., this remarks seems to confuse the question of the truth and that of the efficacy of a philosophical doctrine, and it suggests an unhappily instrumentalized view of philosophy which doesn't sit well with other things Unger says - for example, his interesting remarks on philosophy as thought which is, by definition, between the disciplines.  In the end, it seems best to take the sub-title of the present work with a grain of salt, remembering that a label is only a label (and remembering that "dominant powers" come and go).  What matters are Unger's thoughts, not what to call them; and the thinking in the book can proceed free of association with historical forms of "pragmatism."

2. Freedom and Pluralism.  More serious than these worries over a name are certain  unresolved aporias to which Unger's thought  - as it takes shape since his multi-volume work Politics -  is subject.  At the heart of the matter is the following question:  Why does Unger think that recognizing the ontological truth about human beings (i.e., their freedom or context-transcending nature) grounds or supports a particular political program?  Granted, the human being is a restless creator.  But then laissez faire capitalism, the utopian socialist commune and the theocratic social order are all equally its creations.  How does the premise help recommend one over the other?  Unger tends to argue like this:  "There is no natural order for context-transcending beings like us.  Therefore, we should (or we must) try to create the next best thing:  a context maximally open to self-revision, one which "shortens the distance" between routine and revolution."<!-[if !supportFootnotes]—>5  This sequence is on view in the following passage:

We are not exhausted by the social and cultural worlds we inhabit and build.  They are finite.  We, in comparison to them, are not.  We can see, think, feel, build, and connect in more ways than they can allow.  That is why we are required to rebel against them: to advance our interests and ideals as we now understand them, but also to become ourselves, affirming the polarity that constitutes the law-breaking law of our being.6

Required to rebel?  Without more, this looks like a non-sequitur.  If the premise is that we are context-transcending beings, one could easily think of other ways of continuing on:  "Therefore, there are (for us) a plurality of valid and good ways of life, none any more or less natural or "god-like" than the others.  The life of freedom, and continuous change, can be good; but so can one of stability and tradition.  No society can have all goods — there are too many and they don't all fit together."

In short, it is hard to see how "context-transcendence" (a formalism, an existential feature of human self-consciousness, present wherever human being is present) affords sufficient grounds for distinguishing the good and the bad social order.  So the challenge here would be to save Unger from the charge of merely privileging — dogmatically, without grounds — the value of individual freedom over all others.  No doubt we (we liberals) value freedom.  But does the substantive conclusion — the "therefore" — follow for just everyone, everywhere?  Is Unger's super-charged democracy, the life of continuous revision, the only good or valid way for human beings to live?  Or might not other self-reflectively endorsed forms of the good life — including ones which require relative immunity from change - find accommodation within Unger's structural insight into the nature of the kind of beings we are?  There is a gap in the argument here, but it is one which Unger appears not to see.

There are other, related moments where Unger's argument leaves the reader wanting considerably more than is delivered.  The accommodation of pluralism, for example, has been a major theme of English-speaking political theory.  But while exciting just the same question himself, Unger dismisses such work in a short passage:

The methods of Utility or of the Social Contract generate principles of justice out of our desires and intuitions only by first disregarding our structure-denying longings and speculations, and by treating them as if there were only an insubstantial and insignificant penumbra around the real thing.  By this flattening of the duality of consciousness, however, the humanizing philosophers deliver themselves into the hands of the social world over which they claimed to pass judgment.<!-[if !supportFootnotes]—>7

Needless to say, a Scanlon, a Rawls, a Habermas would not be able to recognize themselves in such a description of their projects; I think that should matter more to Unger than it seems to.  (On this, another word below, under the heading "ethics of writing" — my most serious reservation about Unger's work.)  But leaving this momentarily to one side, what this passage says is really something like this:  "Such theorists remain content to appeal to the intuitions we have now, notwithstanding that, as context-transcending beings, we don't wholly identify with those intuitions:  we also yearn for what is not-yet."  The trouble is not that this is wrong, but that it is obviously formal — without more, empty.  It amounts to saying:  "They see only by the present light."  To which the answer is:  Of course they do.  By what other light should they see?  Does Unger himself have a way of thinking about principles of justice by some other light?  (Or does he think it unimportant to think about them?)  The merely notional possibility that, in a different social world, one would see differently is far too anemic a basis for such a wholesale dismissal of current political theory.  What is needed is to say something of a convincing kind about what the structure-denying longings are which these theorists have disregarded.  Unger might be right about contemporary political theory, but, as it stands, a passage like this speaks only to a reader who is happy to take Unger's word for it.

3.  The Ethics of Writing.  This brings up the final point.  Unger isn't conversational.  His writing does not open itself to questioning or dialectic.  (If Unger is ever unsure about anything, he keeps it hidden.)  So philosophy becomes a legal brief here, or a blast from the pulpit.  We are very far from the patient, attentive, responsive, therapeutic, Socratic interlocutor.  Reading is foreign to Unger's procedures.  Insofar as the Other is present, he is captured in a limited number of alternative "theses" — a few, fabulously abstract options in which all of intellectual life is found to move.  In describing a region of thought, Unger will typically report that there is a central problem, and just three options for solving it, each of which meets with two decisive objections, and so on; and in nearly every chapter we learn of a small — and apparently easily laid out — set of "alternatives," "difficulties," "decisive moves," "strategies," etc. which summarize some region of mind.  This oracular manner of development might be successful, and even of value for its no-messing-around quality, if it weren't for the fact that it takes place with apparent indifference on Unger's part to whether any of the interlocutors are actually able to recognize their own thought within it.  Take for example, what Unger says about "the perennial philosophy" — the major historical "alternative" to "pragmatism," and one that evidently draws on Buddhist sources.  We learn:  "Its cognitive flaw is its failure to recognize how completely and irreparably we are in fact embodied and situated." (p. 16)  Ok, perhaps Buddhists of all ages have failed to understand something — but what?  That you are you and I am I?  Really?  Needless to say, no living practitioner of Buddhism is likely to read Unger's account and say:  "Ah, yes, quite right, that's just what I think!"  And the same goes for most all of the proponents of the philosophical "positions" Unger set his face against.  But Unger spins his story, apparently indifferent to whether there is such recognition or not.  A "decisive objection" or two, and whole centuries of thought are evidently undone in a flash, whole regions of troubled mind resolved in a stroke.

All this makes for forceful and seductive writing, at least on the surface, but it leaves much to be desired as a way of doing philosophy.  And it is the philosophical tradition which Unger here claims to continue, or to give directions for continuing.  Philosophy comes too effortlessly to him for him to be able to do that.  His intellectual procedures, I can't help thinking, must be regressive by his own lights, for they are in tension with the substantive values (openness, the radical potential of encounter with the other, etc.) which he prizes.  Take the qualities which Unger values (openness, encounter, etc.), then negate them, and you'd have a fair characterization of an aspect of the writing.  Take the qualities of social relationship which Unger celebrates, negate them, and you'd have a fair characterization of the sort of relationship his writing enacts with its reader.  There is, in short, a maddening disparity of form and content in Unger's work.  Although its ideas are solidarity and sympathy, Unger's writing is notably impatient and dismissive, obliterating where it should criticize or respond.  It speaks of the radical potential in personal encounter, but it overpowers the other by netting him in the many "theses" and "alternative views" that rigidly structure its intellectual space.  Wanting plasticity and availability to experience, it freezes and fixates — this is common enough in law journal prose, but one would have expected something different from a champion of disentrenchment, fluidity, experimentation, self-disruption and negative capability.  Radical in his substantive ideals, Unger seems, by his own standards, reactionary in the practice of his argument.  Preaching the open road as opposed to the closed script, philosophical investigation in Unger's hands appears to be largely pre-arranged travel through the grooves of well-known arguments; the main problem, as it sometimes depressingly appears, is just to pick the right package for your politics.

I'm inclined to think:  What Unger means by pragmatism can't be very philosophically interesting if it involves this much traditional confidence in the natural unity of philosophical "positions" — the possibility of describing intellectual and moral life as a choice between this, that or the other unified package of philosophical presuppositions.  In all other matters — law, politics, social structure, etc. — Unger is the champion of disunity, contextualization, interpretation and the potential for creative and imaginative re-combination.  From whence does he get his confidence in the self-standing or relatively a-contextual quality of the master philosophical problems?  Or if I have missed the larger point, and Unger doesn't have this confidence, why does he write as if he does?  (Change a few words here and there and you'd have, stylistically, a page out of Thomas' Summa:  "The philosopher says that ____.  But the reply is that ____ and further that ____.")

In making this criticism, and in speaking of Unger as "netting" the other in a set of philosophical theses corresponding to putatively already well-understood positions, I have in mind the contrasting practice of a philosopher like Wittgenstein, who might well be described as a pragmatist (in Unger's broad sense), but who, rather than representing pragmatism as a credo or set of theses to be affirmed or rejected, enacts or embodies his pragmatism in the way he writes philosophy:  viz., a style which dispenses with traditional hierarchies of philosophical concerns, which stands in a relation of patient responsiveness to its interlocutors, no questions suppressed, each requiring a response.  Unger speaks boldly about the entire Western philosophical tradition and its various limited "options," but the truly radical pragmatic experiments within it (like Wittgenstein's) appear unknown to him.  He writes as if everyone were merely the representative of some well-understood "position" opposing a limited set of other well-understood positions.  He shows little awareness that, after Wittgenstein, philosophical radicalism - pragmatism, if you like -  might be felt as a demand on how one goes on writing philosophy, and not just on which already worked-out doctrines one affirms or denies.

Perhaps in the end the strengths and weaknesses of Unger's work are related.  Inspiring in the survey it offers of Western thought, as well as in its radicalization of liberal political themes, the work remains mainly a political manifesto.  Its subject, more than in Unger's previous work, is, of course, philosophy.  But in this it is bound both to excite and disappoint the philosophical reader.  For, as becomes plain here, to write about the subject of philosophy, however brilliantly, is not the same as achieving the radically open quality of philosophy itself.

1 J. P. Sartre, Existentialism as Humanism, p. 63.  ("The best way to conceive of the fundamental project of human reality is to say that man is the being whose project is to be God.")

2 For extended discussion, see my comments on Unger's Politics:  Stone, "The Placement of Politics in Roberto Unger's Politics," Representations 30, 1990; reprinted in Law and the Order of Culture, ed. R. Post, University of California Press, 1991.

3 The Self Awakened, p. 26.

4 Ibid., p. 28. 

5 See, e.g., ibid, p. 54.

6 Ibid., p. 40; my emphasis.

7 Ibid., p. 77.