The Selfish Meme: A Critical Reassessment

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Kate Distin, The Selfish Meme: A Critical Reassessment, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 238pp, $21.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521606276.

Reviewed by Matteo Mameli, King's College, Cambridge


The Selfish Meme is -- disappointingly -- yet another bad book on memetics. Why are there so many bad books on memetics? And what exactly is wrong with these books? Some features of The Selfish Meme can help answer these questions.

Let me start by explaining what memetics is and where it comes from. Memetics is one possible way of using Darwinian evolutionary ideas to study culture. As I shall explain below, it is not the only way of doing this. According to memetics, the essence of culture is constituted by memes and the essence of cultural change is constituted by changes in meme frequencies. Memes are mental states that embody discrete chunks of socially transmissible information. To say that the information that memes embody is socially transmissible is to say that memes can give rise to other memes through social learning. To say that memes embody a discrete chunk of information is to say that, when the information present in a meme is socially transmitted, such information does not usually blend with the information present in other memes. On this view, social transmission is (at least at its most fundamental level) a copying process in which memes generate copies of themselves. Memes are thought to be socially transmissible beliefs, desires, values, and mental representations of tunes, stories, myths, rituals, ways of doing (or saying, or thinking about) things, etc. According to some versions of memetics, it is not just socially transmissible mental states that deserve to be classified as memes, but also those artefacts and activities (including those of a linguistic and textual nature) that can be copied and that can result in the existence of similar artefacts or activities.

Memes can be typed in terms of their informational content (the information they carry) and informational format (the way the information is coded). On the memetic approach, a given culture at a given moment in time is best described by listing the memes present in that culture at that time and the (relative and absolute) frequencies of these memes. Cultural change is captured in terms of changes in meme frequencies. According to memeticists, most changes in meme frequencies are due to differences in meme fitness. Some memes have an informational content or an informational format that makes them more likely (in a given social, biological, and physical environment) to be passed on. Such memes have higher memetic fitness, i.e. on average they generate more copies of themselves than other memes. Memes have higher fitness when they are easier to pass on, when they are good at motivating people to pass them on, when they are more likely to be present in influential individuals (individuals that are more likely to be taken as sources of cultural information by others), when they are particularly memorable or salient, etc.

This view of culture and cultural change was famously presented in its basic form by Richard Dawkins in The Selfish Gene. Dawkins suggested that it is possible and perhaps also theoretically fruitful to think about cultural change in terms that are analogous to those in which biologists think about biological change. Dawkins's picture of biological evolution is one in which biological change at the trans-generational scale is captured in terms of changes in gene frequencies. Genes, as evolutionary units, are seen as discrete (non-blending) chunks of DNA. Genes produce phenotypic effects on organisms and (in the case of extended phenotypes) on their environments and they can be passed on intact to the next generation by means of mechanisms such as meiosis, gamete formation, and fertilization. Each gene can be copied, i.e. it can generate similar chunks of DNA. Such chunks of DNA can inhabit and influence future (descendant) organisms. In a given (physical, biological, and social) environment, different genes have different chances of being copied and of being represented in future generations. These chances depend on the phenotypic effects that each gene produces -- in combination with other genes -- on the organism it inhabits and (in the case of extended phenotypes) on the environment. That is, different genes have different fitness values. According to Dawkins, most of the significant changes in gene frequencies are due to these differences in genetic fitness values. The similarities between this view of biological change and the view of cultural change outlined above are evident.

In contemporary biological terminology, when a gene "out-reproduces" other genes (and thereby increases in frequency) because it has some properties that (in its environment) make the gene more likely to be copied (and to be represented in future generations), the gene is said to have increased in frequency because of Darwinian selection. This terminology is the result of an elaboration in statistical language of the ideas that Charles Darwin first presented in The Origin of Species. Dawkins's suggestion in The Selfish Gene was that the same kind of selectionist thinking that biologists apply to biological change might be fruitfully applied to cultural change. He made this suggestion again in The Extended Phenotype, but with the addition of some important caveats.

Dawkins's gene-selectionism has been criticised by many authors (myself included, Mameli 2004) and for many reasons (sometimes good, sometimes not so good). But the importance of The Selfish Gene and The Extended Phenotype is undeniable. In those books, Dawkins summarised and developed some new strategies for thinking about evolutionary processes that authors like William D. Hamilton, John Maynard Smith, and George C. Williams had elaborated in the previous decades. Dawkins's writings contributed to the spread of these important ideas and engendered an interesting debate about the relative merits of different conceptions of biological change. My opinion is that gene-selectionism has some important limitations (and, thereby, mischaracterises in some important ways biological evolution) but is an interesting (and sometimes useful) way of looking at evolutionary processes. Can we say the same about meme-selectionism? Can The Selfish Meme do for culture what The Selfish Gene did for biology?

The idea of the meme as an evolutionary unit of culture is elegant and intriguing. Because of this, Dawkins's remarks about memes have motivated many to try to think about culture in evolutionary terms. This, as I shall explain below, is a good thing, but it is not good enough. There is at least one important difference between gene-selectionism and meme-selectionism. When Dawkins presented gene-selectionism, a lot was already known about things such as (1) the way genetic transmission works, (2) the way new genetic variants are generated, (3) the structure of populations, (4) how genetic transmission and genetic mutation affect population processes and vice versa, etc. Gene-selectionism can be seen as an interesting approach only in the context of a theory of transmission, mutation, and populations. The same applies to meme-selectionism. But when Dawkins presented his theory of memes, very little was known about how cultural transmission works, about how new cultural variants are generated, about how such processes affect populations, and about how population structure affects cultural transmission and cultural innovation. It was perhaps the awareness of this fact that led Dawkins in The Extended Phenotype to be more cautious about the prospects for memetics than he had been in The Selfish Gene. He admitted (at least implicitly) that a lot of work needed to be done in order to transform memetics from a set of speculations into a science of cultural processes. The same admission has been made (and very explicitly) by Dan Dennett in some of his writings on the topic (Dennett 1995, 2003).

Due to Dawkins's and Dennett's skills as popular writers, the idea of the meme as a unit of culture has attracted a lot of attention among the general public. But the problem with the memetic literature is that most of the people who have written on memetics seem to lack either the motivation or the competence to do what is needed to transform memetics into a productive scientific enterprise. Self-proclaimed memeticists are usually not interested in (or capable of) developing an empirically grounded theory of the mechanisms responsible for cultural transmission, for the generation of new cultural variants, for the way transmission and innovation interact with population-level processes, etc. As a consequence, memeticists are not in a position to judge whether the implicit assumptions of the theory of memes -- such as the particulate nature of the fundamental cultural units, the lack of blending, the central role of selection processes, etc. -- are correct. It is for this reason that, despite the size of the memetic literature, Dawkins's and Dennett's remarks about memes have been to a large extent theoretically sterile.

The Selfish Meme is a paradigmatic example of this phenomenon. In this book, cultural transmission is dealt with (and very superficially) in a couple of pages. The same applies to cultural innovation. No mention of population processes is present. The author spends many pages trying to argue that, in spite of appearances, culture could really be particulate and that blending need not occur. But she offers no empirical evidence in support of the claim that culture really is particulate and that blending does not occur. The book is almost entirely free of any empirical content.

In a chapter of the book, the author asks herself whether it is possible to find something that plays in the theory of cultural evolution the same role that DNA plays in the theory of genetic evolution. The author is right in thinking that this is an important question, but she does not seem to understand why this is so and, thereby, she gives the wrong kind of answer.

The theory of DNA is the theory of how DNA is transferred from organism to organism, of how it mutates, and of how it is used within a given organism. This theory plays an important role in the current understanding of genetic evolution. The theory provides a way of keeping track of some of the basic mechanisms that underlie genetic evolution. Formal models of genetic evolution make assumptions that match what is known about DNA and the way it is used in development and reproduction. This results in more realistic models. The theory of DNA makes the theory of genetic evolution much more powerful and accurate than it would otherwise be. Can we find something that does the same for the theory of cultural evolution?

According to the author, the solution is to be found in the theory of mental content: mental content is cultural DNA. On her view, while the best way of identifying genes is in terms of DNA sequences, the best way of identifying memes is in terms of mental contents. As a consequence, the theory of mental content can advance our understanding of cultural evolution in the same way that the theory of DNA has advanced our understanding of genetic evolution.

These claims are highly problematic. I have already mentioned that, if memes really exist, their transmission is heavily affected not only by their content (the information they carry) but also by their format (the way the information is coded). Let us leave this to one side and let us suppose that the author is right in thinking that memes must be identified by their content only. Unless there is a tight connection between the mental content of memes and the way memes can be transmitted from one organism to another, the theory of mental content cannot help us understand cultural processes. Many incompatible theories of mental content exist and all such theories are extremely controversial. Thus, given that we do not (at least at the moment) have a good theory of mental content, even if there were a tight connection between mental content and transmission processes, we would not be able to use such connection in order to advance our understanding of cultural processes. This means that the strategy suggested by the author is certainly not the best possible strategy for transforming memetics into a productive research programme. The only way to find the cultural equivalent of the theory of DNA is to conduct serious empirical investigations about the mechanisms of cultural transmission and innovation. No shortcuts are available.

The Selfish Meme is a paradigmatic example of the failure of memetics to become a serious scientific enterprise. Such failure does not necessarily mean that we should give up the idea of studying cultural change evolutionarily. There are other ways of applying Darwinian evolutionary ideas to culture. At the beginning of the 1970's, in the years before The Selfish Gene was published, thinkers such as Luca Cavalli Sforza, Mark Feldman, Peter Richerson, and Robert Boyd started adapting the tools of population genetics to the study of cultural processes. This approach has generated many interesting results but, due to its technical nature, it has not been the topic of any best-selling book. Only very recently this approach has gained the attention of a larger audience. This is due mainly to the publication of Not By Genes Alone, a book where Richerson and Boyd explain the approach in a simple and maths-free way (Richerson and Boyd 2005).

Researchers in this tradition do what serious memeticists should have done. They attempt to base their theory of cultural change on empirically grounded assumptions about cultural transmission, cultural innovation, and population processes, and they test their models by looking at whether they have any genuine predictive power. These models are sometimes not as explanatorily successful as one would hope. But despite the difficulties, this approach -- in stark contrast with memetics -- is a productive research programme and keeps generating interesting results.

Some of the models show that cultural evolution of a Darwinian kind can occur even when cultural variants are not faithfully copied discrete particles (Boyd and Richerson 2005). That is, pace Dawkins, cultural evolution of a Darwinian kind can occur even when, strictly speaking, there are no memes at all. But -- one may wonder -- how is it possible to see culture as an evolutionary system once we give up the assumption that it is made up of particulate gene-like entities? This is obviously an important question. Let me outline the answer.

Biological evolution is a change in the statistical distribution of biological (phenotypic or genetic) traits within a population (or a set of populations). Whether and how this statistical distribution changes can be explained in terms of two sets of factors (and of the interactions between them): transmission factors and selection factors. Let us consider them in turn. Organisms are causally connected with their descendants by means of what are sometimes called "inheritance channels". These channels are transmission factors. Genetic transmission is the most important of these channels but -- as I have argued elsewhere (Mameli 2004) -- it is not the only one. These causal connections between the generations are responsible for the extent to which (and for the way in which) organisms resemble their offspring. Thereby, such causal connections affect the extent to which (and the way in which) the statistical distribution of a trait in a given generation depends on the statistical distribution of that trait (or some related traits) in the previous generation. Explanations of changes in the distribution of traits that appeal to selection factors, in contrast, refer not to the features of inheritance channels but to the way biological traits affect the chances that organisms have of surviving and reproducing. Selection occurs when a trait increases in frequency because it makes the organisms that possess it more likely to do things that result -- through reproduction -- in the existence of other organisms with the same trait. As Bill Wimsatt has pointed out, the distinction between transmission factors and selection factors is in some cases blurred (Wimsatt 1999), but in general it provides a theoretically fruitful way of analysing biological change.

Similarly to biological evolution, cultural evolution is a change in the statistical distribution of cultural (socially transmissible) traits within a population (or set of populations). Just like in the biological case, whether and how this statistical distribution changes over time can be explained in terms of (the interactions between) transmission factors and selection factors. Humans possess cognitive mechanisms that allow them to learn from other organisms and to transmit what they have learned to other organisms. Such cognitive mechanisms constitute "cultural inheritance channels". These channels are cultural transmission factors and are responsible for the extent to which (and for the way in which) the mental states and behaviour of an individual resemble the mental states and behaviour of some other individuals, i.e. those with which the individual has had some cognitive contact. Thereby, such causal connections affect the extent to which (and the way in which) the statistical distribution of a cultural trait at a given time depends on the statistical distribution of that trait (or related cultural traits) at a previous time. Explanations of changes in the distribution of cultural traits that appeal to selection factors, in contrast, refer not to the features of cultural transmission but to the way cultural traits affect the chances that organisms have of being selected as sources of cultural information. Cultural selection occurs when a cultural trait increases in frequency because it makes the organisms that possess it more likely to become cultural models. Just as in the biological case, the distinction between transmission factors and selection factors is very useful, despite there being cases in which it cannot be drawn in an unambiguous way.

The idea that biological change can be explained by appealing to transmission and selection factors was Darwin's idea. This idea has been elaborated in many important respects in the last 150 years, but Darwin's original insight has withstood the test of time. Biological change is best understood in terms of a Darwinian evolutionary system, a system where the composition of populations is determined by a combination of transmission and selection factors. The same is true of cultural change. Cultural change is best understood in terms of a system where the (cultural) composition of populations is determined by a combination of (cultural) transmission and selection factors. Culture is a Darwinian evolutionary system.

The existence of gene-like particles is an important feature of transmission processes in the biological case. But the way I have described biological change shows that such particles are not an essential feature of a Darwinian evolutionary system. This applies to cultural change too. This is the reason why culture can be a Darwinian evolutionary system even if memes do not exist. By insisting on gene-like particles, memetics mischaracterises cultural processes and provides the wrong framework for an evolutionary analysis of culture.

How should memeticists react to all this? I think their reaction should be positive. Let me explain. The author of The Selfish Meme does not tell us her motivations for defending memetics. But consider for example Dennett's motivations. Dennett believes that the traditional approaches to the social sciences have failed to explain cultural processes. He also believes that those we might call "super-naturalists" are wrong. Super-naturalists are people who think that cultural processes (and the human minds which generate them) are "super-natural", i.e. not part of the natural order and not explainable in scientific terms. Dennett has decided to use memetics as a heuristic and explanatory tool in order to show how -- at least in principle -- culture can result from the workings of relatively simple cognitive mechanisms, mechanisms that are no doubt part of the natural order. He thinks that memetics can be a useful heuristic device despite not being a productive research programme. Whether he is right on this is a difficult issue that I cannot discuss here. But it seems to me that any memeticist who shares Dennett's motivations -- which are, I think, good motivations -- should be glad that there exists a Darwinian view of culture which is a productive research programme. They should be glad even though this evolutionary view of culture shows that -- in some important respects -- memetics is wrong.


Boyd, R. and Richerson, P. 2005. The Origin and Evolution of Cultures. Oxford University Press, Oxford.

Dawkins, R. 1976. The Selfish Gene. Oxford University Press, Oxford.

Dawkins, R. 1982. The Extended Phenotype. Oxford University Press, Oxford.

Dennett, D.C. 1995. Darwin's Dangerous Idea. Simon & Schuster, New York.

Dennett, D.C. 2003. Freedom Evolves. Allen Lane, New York.

Mameli, M. 2004. Nongenetic selection and nongenetic inheritance. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 55, 37-71.

Richerson, P. and Boyd, R. 2005. Not By Genes Alone. University of Chicago Press, Chicago.

Wimsatt, W.C. 1999. Genes, memes and cultural heredity. Biology and Philosophy 14, 279-310.