The Seventh Sense: Francis Hutcheson and Eighteenth-Century Aesthetics

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Kivy, Peter, The Seventh Sense: Francis Hutcheson and Eighteenth-Century Aesthetics, Oxford, 2003, 416pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199260028.

Reviewed by Timothy M. Costelloe, The College of William and Mary


As Peter Kivy points out in the Preface to his new enlarged edition of The Seventh Sense, even some twenty-seven years after its first appearance the work remains the only book-length study of both Francis Hutcheson’s Inquiries and the seminal role they have played in the history of modern aesthetics. While much has been written since the first edition was published in 1976, both on Hutcheson and the eighteenth century origins of aesthetics more generally, nobody has attempted to revisit so comprehensively the ground originally uncovered by Kivy’s efforts. Unlike most second editions, however, a change of subtitle and a new publisher, notwithstanding, the author has chosen not to “lay violent hands” on the text, opting instead to supplement it with seven of his essays written since the book appeared, and previously published in various journals and collections. These provide “’revisions’ in their own way,” Kivy remarks (x), and together constitute the new third part of the book—”The Logic of Taste”—with Parts I and II containing an imprint of the original 1976 edition.

Part I—”Hutcheson’s First ’Inquiry’“—begins with a survey of Hutcheson’s philosophical forbears, locating in the likes of Lord Herbert of Cherbury’s “natural instincts,” Henry More’s “sense of virtue,” and especially Shaftesbury’s “harmony of parts,” the conceptual predecessors of philosophical categories Hutcheson was to make his own: the faculty of taste and the sense of beauty. At the same time, Hutcheson’s originality, Kivy emphasizes, lies in his decisive break with the past, his courage to rush in where the pre-moderns feared to tread and unite English Platonism with John Locke, the “guiding spirit of Hutcheson’s aesthetic theory” (25). Over the course of five consecutive chapters Kivy guides the reader through the intricacies of this achievement. Combining his considerable analytic skills with an intimate knowledge of the texts, Kivy clarifies Hutcheson’s understanding of “sense,” “beauty,” and “beautiful,” reconstructs a philosophy of art from his various remarks, and, in the final chapter of Part I, considers what he calls Hutcheson’s “theological aesthetics.” Hutcheson’s accomplishment, Kivy concludes, lies in the “vital role” of “aesthetic sense” in “forming … aesthetic philosophy as we know it today” (122), and, more importantly, in carving out a “separate realm of experience … made manifest by [his] sense of beauty” (123).

Along the way there are some real gems of interpretation. In Chapter 3, for instance (“The Sense of ’Beauty’“), Kivy unravels the often muddled manner in which Hutcheson picks up and weaves Locke’s way of ideas into his thinking. This is a task complicated by Hutcheson’s tendency to characterize “beauty” (for Locke a “mixed mode”) both as a secondary idea and as a special kind of pleasure; in some passages Hutcheson does not bother to disambiguate the meaning of the term at all. Kivy solves the puzzle (with a little help from Bishop Berkeley’s discussion of “heat” and “pain” in the Dialogues) by arguing that Hutcheson views them as “two descriptions of the same simple idea” (57). Some equally fancy philosophical footwork is on display in chapter 4 (“The Sense of ’Beautiful’“) where Kivy effectively undermines the noncognitivist reading of Hutcheson—the view that to say “X is beautiful” is to express, but not describe, a state of mind—by way of the latter’s philosophy of language. The noncognitivist interpretation is untenable, Kivy argues, because Hutcheson’s (Lockean) linguistic commitments rule out such an analysis in principle: since “Hutcheson did not recognize the nondescriptive use of language,” Kivy points out, “the possibility that ’X is beautiful’ both describes the state of feeling I am in and expresses it does not exist for Hutcheson. Expressing is describing—and that is the end of that” (65).

As admiring as he is of Hutcheson’s overall achievement, however, Kivy has no qualms in holding his doctrines to the highest standards of twentieth century philosophical rigor, and, on more than one occasion, of finding them sorely wanting. In his discussion of aesthetic sense, for example, Kivy shows that none of Hutcheson’s criteria—independence from the will, innateness, independence from knowledge, and immediacy—is sufficient for distinguishing it from reason (36ff.); he is rightly suspicious of Hutcheson’s analytic and non-falsifiable conception of “disagreement” (81-82); and while full of praise for the formalist elements implicit in Hutcheson’s approach to the arts, he is quick to point out how his “arousal theory” of musical expression is hopelessly at odds with the representational theory of literature he also espouses (108-109). At certain points, Kivy is clearly frustrated with the imprecision and sometime incoherence of Hutcheson’s position, and when it comes to the latter’s attempt to address “the existence of God, and the theological underpinnings of aesthetic perception”—topics which occupy “about one-third” of the first Inquiry (111)—Kivy (by his own admission) can hide his impatience no longer. Hutcheson’s version of the design argument founders impotently on the problem of evil, Kivy urges, and amounts to little more than saying “We are the way we are … because God wishes to please us” (121). Although mitigated by the enormity of the task he set himself, “Hutcheson’s aesthetic theology,” Kivy concludes, amounts to “deplorable backsliding” (123).

Part II—Hutcheson-And Shortly Thereafter”—amounts to a natural history of the sense of beauty as the concept “worked itself out in eighteenth century Britain” (127). Kivy follows the fate of Hutcheson’s theory from three “rationalist” critics of moral sense (John Balguy, Berkeley, and Richard Price) through David Hume’s “Of the Standard of Taste” and Thomas Reid’s common sense philosophy—the “final flowering” of Hutcheson’s doctrine (158)—to its eventual defeat by its “bosom serpent: the association of ideas,” tamed and led by the likes of Archibald Alison and Dugald Stewart. Indeed, as Kivy tells the tale, the inner sense doctrine met its end through one aspect of the very philosophy—Locke’s way of ideas—that had given it life. Since Hutcheson was willing to use associationism “negatively” to explain diversity in the face of an ostensibly universal sense or instinct (82ff.), there was no reason why others should not use the same doctrine “positively” to explain all pleasure and displeasure as the product of association. Inner sense could then be dispensed with altogether, and taste become—as it did for Stewart—simply an acquired power of discrimination (216).

Reading—or for many rereading—Kivy’s book, gives one a sense of why it still remains the only study of its kind: it is hard to imagine how any rewriting could have improved the book’s philosophical content, and, combined with Kivy’s faith that he “got things more or less right” the first time around, it seems perfectly reasonable to have left good alone. At the same time, however, Kivy has continued to write about Hutcheson and eighteenth century aesthetics, and himself remarks on how in the course of so doing he has “become clearer about some things, less sure of others,” and, “from time to time” even changed his mind (ix). Hence the collection of essays to “supplement” and “revise” the original edition.

Taken individually, the essays are a pleasure to read: clear, informative, and precise, like The Seventh Sense itself. Many, if not all, of the essays will be familiar to students of eighteenth century aesthetics, especially “The Logic of Taste--the First Fifty Years” and “Hume’s Neighbour’s Wife”—chapters 13 and 16, respectively—which have become minor classics in the field. Yet one drawback to “revising” the text in this manner is that the essays are effectively left to speak for themselves, and, as a result, it is not always easy to locate exactly where Kivy’s changes of mind have occurred. Further, the scene-setting and philosophical detail clearly required for self-contained articles sometimes appears as redundancy when read directly after The Seventh Sense: many of the substantive issues in Part III have already been addressed in Parts I and II and, on important points of interpretation, Kivy’s conclusions do not seem to have changed that much. Summaries of Hutcheson’s basic doctrines (Chapters 2-5) and his indebtedness to Locke (Chapters 2 and 4), for example, reappear at various junctures; that Hutcheson’s idea of beauty is complex (Chapter 3) is rehearsed again in response to a paper by Dabney Townsend (Chapter14); the non-cognitivist character of Hutcheson’s philosophy (Chapter 4) is restated while uncovering a “logic of taste” in Addison’s essays (Chapter 13), and the analysis of Hutcheson’s philosophy of art (Chapter 5) is recast in an essay on Hutcheson’s place in the history of aesthetics (Chapter 15). This is not to deny that there are significant changes of emphasis in the later essays: the argument that Hutcheson moves from the aesthetic to the moral while Hume from the moral to the aesthetic is a case in point (Chapter 16), as are the final two essays (Chapters 19 and 20), where Kivy argues that Reid’s aesthetics represents both an alternative to the moral sense tradition (chapter 19) and that his originality and importance lies in the fact that he “put the capstone on eighteenth British aesthetics … in so far as it was a theory of perception” (338). Nonetheless, the reader would have been well-served had Kivy offered some explicit pointers as to precisely how his views have developed and altered over the intervening years.

In the final analysis, however, this is mere carping, and it should detract neither from the undisputable value of Kivy’s achievement nor from the service done to the philosophical community by Oxford University Press in bringing the work back into print. As Hutcheson and his contemporaries were fond of emphasizing, one mark of excellence in any creative or scholarly endeavor is that it has stood the test of time, and received, as Addison puts it, “the sanction of the politer part of our contemporaries.” Kivy’s book passes this test with flying colors, and there is no reason to think that it will not endure through a span of further years with the same resilience that has seen it so well through the past three decades.