The Significance of Religious Experience

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Howard Wettstein, The Significance of Religious Experience, Oxford University Press, 2012, 240pp., $65.00, ISBN 9780199841363.

Reviewed by Jerome Gellman, Ben Gurion University of the Negev


This book is unique in writings in philosophy of religion. In it Wettstein presents a sensitive, philosophically sophisticated, first-person account of his understanding of the religion he practices, traditional Judaism, and uses that understanding to make observations about religion in general. The book is an exceptionally good example of a neo-Wittgenstein type of approach to "God-talk." With its autobiographical form it goes further than most to show the reader how such an approach can be lived with spiritual depth.

There are thirteen chapters, eleven of them previously published over a period of sixteen years. The earliest published essays were written when the author, in his words, "was struggling with coming back to religious life," after having been out for some time. These tend to be rather stark and straightforward against metaphysics and against the importance of belief in religion. The essays that had been published later tend to be more subtle and nuanced. The developmental character of the essays -- the transition from the earlier ones, more loudly philosophically atheistic, to the later more nuanced ones -- make stating an overall view of the book a challenge. What follows is the impression the book made on this reader.

There exists considerable overlap between most of the chapters, for which reason I will review the themes that run through the book rather than present the book chapter by chapter. In his personal confession, Wettstein tells us that he has "great confidence in the power of religious practice and the virtues of the religious life." (p. 27). At the same time, early and late in the book Wettstein proclaims himself a naturalist (Chapter 3, and pp. 48, 51-53, 207), who is "with those who reject belief in the supernatural." (p. 27) The theme of much of the book, then, is to present Wettstein's "thoroughly naturalistic" approach to Judaism and its God. He does not offer us a translation scheme of God-language into a naturalist language. Instead, Wettstein sees traditional Judaism as a practice that invokes images, including God-images, with shared behaviors, advancing and embodying values important to the community. To practice well one must have an ear "for the relevant music," for living a life that embodies the relevant responses and the favored reactions, including thought, when confronting life situations. Thus, Wettstein locates himself within a religious community he defines in the above manner, rather than as people who believe such and such propositions about God.

Mostly, Wettstein is determined to demote the category of "belief" in his religion, noting that the Hebrew Bible has no word corresponding to that concept, and noting how belief, as opposed to practice, plays a minor part in ancient Jewish texts. (pp. 86ff, 109-112, 115, 204, 213ff). In a more nuanced chapter 5, however, on poetic imagery and religious belief, Wettstein cites his critique of propositional belief from his philosophy of language to recognize non-propositional religious belief. To ascribe religious belief in this way, he suggests, is to extract a piece of the whole picture from out of its context, and really means something like, "The image plays a fundamental role for her." (p. 89) These hints deserve further development and defense.

Wettstein practices Judaism in the way a mathematician might be expected to do mathematics (pp. 27, 60, 212-213). Just as the latter can engage in, appreciate, and make contributions to, mathematics without metaphysical commitments on the existence of numbers, just so does Wettstein practice his Judaism without a metaphysical commitment to God. (pp. 27, 212-213) Wettstein though, being a naturalist, does not simply ignore the metaphysical question, but, in several places, pronounces supernaturalism to be "clearly mythological." Just as a religious Jew who rejects the truth of the Genesis account of creation will still cherish the Genesis story for its edifying force, just so, Wettstein tells us, a religious Jew can treat talk about God as devoid of metaphysical truth yet deem that talk and its images central to the religious life.

In chapter 4, Wettstein makes superb use of Wittgenstein on pain to illustrate how he sees the language of Judaism. Just as for Wittgenstein the focus of pain-talk is on pain behavior and its expressive uses in a form of life, so the language of Judaism is for him is a matter of expressive language and accompanying modes of behavior in a religious form of life. In both cases, reference to an entity, a pain or God, need not arise.

Wettstein's approach to Judaism rejects medieval Jewish philosophy, along with metaphysical theology, as alien to the Hebrew Bible and to the Talmudic period, where metaphysics is all but absent. (See especially, Chapter 6, "Against Theology".) Metaphysical theology intruded into Judaism from a Greek bent of mind, and warped native Jewish understanding. On similar grounds, Wettstein rejects the very formulation of the problem of evil in philosophy as illicitly invoking metaphysics with an idea of a perfect omni-God alien to the Hebrew Bible and the Talmudic period. (Chapter 8, "Against Theodicy") Nowhere in those foundational texts is God said to be perfect, and nowhere in those texts is evil a philosophical problem, as opposed to being an existential-religious problem. On the contrary, the Hebrew Bible shows the dark side of God (p. 164), says Wettstein, and divine vulnerability. (p. 169) This is hardly material for the philosophical problem of evil.

In a similar vein, Wettstein rejects alleged experiences of God as proving God's existence, on both philosophical and religious grounds. (Chapter 7) On philosophical grounds, his main complaint is that such experiences are not repeatable at will: "Ordinary, every day, perception, by contrast, is reliably repeatable. One can return to a room and typically see exactly what one expects to see." (p. 138). Here Wettstein is thinking of God as a stationary, inert object that should be accessible at all times if accessible at all. Since God is not accessible at all times, he wants to argue, we cannot know that God is accessible at any time. This is surprising, since Wettstein likes to stress the multifarious images of God in the religious life, which strongly suggests a fluid, dynamic God. In any case, it would be more apt to compare the phenomenology of experiences of God to that of getting to see an elusive person with an uncanny ability to willfully initiate or prevent himself being observed, according to his own rules of procedure. Experience of that person is not repeatable at the subject's will as is entering a room and seeing the walls one saw yesterday.

On religious grounds, Wettstein's rejection points to the way experiences of God function in religious practice. A subject might cherish experiences of that sort as reflecting the depth of her "religious involvement," (p. 141) but she would not ordinarily think of them as proving anything. Teresa of Avila is a paradigm of that attitude, according to Rowan Williams, Wettstein points out, who writes that Teresa would never have dreamt of proving anything from her profound mystical experiences. We are back to Wettstein's focus on images and their religious efficacy, and avoidance of what might involve belief or metaphysics.

Now Wettstein might be right about Teresa and some others, but he misses the way conversion experiences work. In February, 2012, I visited the Alister Hardy Religious Experience Research Centre in Lampert, Wales, where I read well over one hundred reports of twentieth century religious experiences from ordinary folk. A majority of those I read reported experiences of God that convinced the subject to become religious. They were convinced that God had made himself known to them. Whether or not we take these to be instances of proofs, exactly, they are clearly instances of religious experiences being taken as grounds for becoming religious. They proceed and induce religious practice, and do not only signal one's already intense religious involvement.

One of the author's major tenets is that religion begins in a sense of awe, in a sense of mystery about life and the world, and that religion nurtures this sense for the purpose of human flourishing. (pp. 29, 40-47, 135ff, 154, 204-207) This fits well with Maimonides' dictum that the way to achieve love and fear of God is through cultivating awe at the experience of God's wondrous creation. Faith "begins in awe," says Wettstein, and involves a resolve to generalize one's sense of awe in life. Religion cultivates steadfastness in awe. From the amplified experience of awe in religion a person learns humility and comes to feel gratitude for life, ideally issuing in self-transformation away from self-centeredness to other-centeredness.

Wettstein's Judaism is theater acting. He engages wholeheartedly in the drama, like an actor in a play who lives the part by "suspending disbelief" (p. 52). Theater informs "countless aspects" of the religious Jew's life (p. 53), but, "of course, one doesn't feel and act in these ways all the time." (p. 101) When engaged, Wettstein acts and feels as if he is experiencing something real. When disengaged, Wettstein knows he is a naturalist and that whatever "truth" there is, it is not metaphysical truth.

In prayer especially, Wettstein thinks one can "facilitate general awe" (p. 47) by experiencing prayer as an audience with God. In doing so, one engages "wholeheartedly with a mythology," of which the lack of truth is not relevant. One can enter so deeply into the drama as to know prayer as an "experience of intimacy, of sharing one's longings, pains, joys and the rest." (p. 172)

Is Wettstein a non-realist about God? "God is real" as a philosophical-metaphysical pronouncement is false for Wettstein. So, he is a philosophical non-realist. But let the same sentence be used in a religious performance, and then Wettstein, as I understand him, would strongly back that utterance. After all, how could he pray to God if there were no God? So he is a realist inside his religion -- a religious realist. Religiously speaking, Wettstein would not want to be categorized as an atheist.

Seeing this book as a witness to Judaism, a reader can well appreciate that certain considerations and arguments have influenced Wettstein in his personal understanding of Judaism. In that genre, Wettstein's confessional is superbly written, absorbing, and religiously instructive. Yet, Wettstein means his book to contribute to philosophy of religion. He is urging these considerations on the reader and making claims about religion, not just his religion. That's why he did not title his book, The Nature of My Religious Experience, but The Nature of Religious Experience, simpliciter. As a work in the philosophy of religion, though, three problems surfaced for me in Wettstein's approach to Judaism. It would be well for the author to address these problems in his future writings so as to make his position more secure.

Problem One: I doubt the very possibility of Wettstein being able to as much as state his non-realist philosophical position within traditional Judaism. A Jew is commanded to love God with all her heart, with all her soul, and all her strength. (Deuteronomy 6:5) Maimonides instructs us as to a proper love of God: "It is to love God with a great, abundant, most powerful love, until one's soul is bound up with love of God so that one is absorbed in it constantly . . . when one is sitting, when one stands, and when one is eating and drinking." (my emphasis) Love of God is called a mitzvah t'midit, an obligation of constant application. (Sefer Hachinuch, thirteenth century, anonymous author) One of the great rabbinical figures of the twentieth century, Rabbi Abraham Isaac Kook, wrote an introduction to his commentary to the Jewish prayer book, in which the theme is "the constant prayer of the soul." This is all accepted as mainstream in traditional Judaism, and thus has that tradition understood Psalms 16:8, "I have set the Lord always before me." In other words, the ideal in traditional Judaism is to be at all times in a state of mind akin to what Wettstein finds in prayer, one of loving intimacy with God, to a degree to which there is no greater. One can agree with Wettstein, "of course, one doesn't feel and act in these ways all the time or all at the same time." But from the point of view of traditional Judaism this is a fallen state. The ideal draws us precisely, in Wettstein's words, "to feel and act in these ways all the time." It is to this that the traditional Jew is to aspire.

When intimate with God, Wettstein tells us he must suspend disbelief, throwing himself into prayer and other religious activities entirely. That is because occurrent philosophical disbelief ruptures the spell of occurrent religious theatrics. It follows that Wettstein's non-realism must not be stated. For to do so is to step out of the religious into the philosophical, to acknowledge that God does not exist, at a time -- which is all times - when one is obligated to think, religiously, of God as existing. Wettstein's non-realism thus becomes properly normatively ineffable for traditional Judaism. There is no time at which it may be uttered or thought. Indeed, the difference between philosophical realism and non-realism collapses within the Jewish ideal, for in that ideal there exists only the religious context. There exists no place outside of that context to declare non-realism. Wettstein's book becomes normatively ineffable. It cannot even first be stated and then kicked away like a ladder used to climb up and then no longer needed. As a traditional Jew, Wettstein has an obligation to aim for the ideal and thus to overcome his philosophical non-realism for the sake of the religious life.

Problem Two: On a somewhat related issue, it is hard to see how Wettstein can reject metaphysics on the grounds that neither the Bible nor the Talmudic rabbis engaged in metaphysics, and at the same time affirm naturalism as his agenda and bring that to bear on ancient Judaism. After all, neither the Bible nor the rabbis ever engaged in such an enterprise. Is not a doctrine of naturalism a foreign element to classical Judaism as much as metaphysics? Wettstein, I imagine, feels obliged to accept naturalism because of convincing, to him, scientific and philosophical developments since the Bible and the Talmud, and so feels the need to interpret his religion accordingly. That is a respectable and understandable modification. After all, much has changed since days of old. So, why shouldn't a religious metaphysician possess the same prerogative as Wettstein? Suppose she is convinced of the importance of making good philosophical, metaphysical sense of God to herself, in an age of rampant secularism and naturalism. If she writes a book about her metaphysical approach to her Judaism, it is difficult to see how she would be doing anything intrinsically different from what our author does with his naturalism and his Judaism. It then seems arbitrary to ban metaphysics the way Wettstein does.

Problem Three: Wettstein makes the form of life whose shape is given by the Hebrew Bible and the Talmudic period the test of what is genuinely Jewish and what is not. On this ground, Wettstein dismisses metaphysical theology. In doing so, whether intending it or not, he is in danger of endorsing a severely arrested development upon traditional Judaism, banning all that has come after the classic period. With the same wave of the hand with which he pushes aside metaphysics because it is not in the Bible and Talmud, he also might have to put aside all other developments in traditional Judaism since then -- the kabbalah, Hasidism, the ethically focused Mussar movement, and more. None of these, each within traditional Judaism, were articulated in the Bible or the Talmud, and precedents for each can be found on the outside. He must also reject Jewish feminism, even the attenuated sort that has appeared within Orthodox Judaism. Neither Moses nor Rabbi Akiva was a feminist, and clearly feminist consciousness came into Judaism from the outside, no less so than metaphysical theology. If the Biblical and Talmudic images are to be determinative, Wettstein might have to employ angels and demons within his Judaic theatrical images when facing and responding to daily life.

The problem here is that the very practice of traditional Judaism for two thousand years has included amplification, revision, borrowing, and sheer creativity far beyond the borders of the Hebrew Bible and the Talmud. That is the way traditional Judaism has been practiced. To freeze traditional Judaism way back then is to be untrue to its historical reality and to how it functions in people's lives. If metaphysical thinking about God was and is deemed important by a segment of traditional Jews, then so be it.

Moses Mendelsohn once dealt with the relationship between metaphysics and his Judaism, and came up with a two-tier view. One tier was that of religious "common sense," which stands on its own without the need of metaphysical backing. A second tier consists of metaphysical arguments and explanations serving the intellectual enhancement of Judaism beyond the level of common sense. Such a view would grant Wettstein the desired autonomy of his practice of Judaism from any metaphysical underpinning, yet allow Judaism's intellectual enhancement at a second tier, for those to whom such enhancement is important in their religious lives. Perhaps Wettstein will be open to others wanting to think of metaphysics along the lines of Mendelsohn.

To conclude, do read this book for its engaging, human, style, its welcome enrichment of the possibilities of the religious life, and for its serious challenges to much that goes on today in analytic philosophy of religion. Let us hope that the author will be attentive to problems I have raised and benefit us with a further development of his thoughts on the philosophy of religion.