The Social Turn in Moral Psychology

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Mark Fedyk, The Social Turn in Moral Psychology, MIT Press, 2017, 246 pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262035569.

Reviewed by Adam R. Thompson, University of Nebraska


Mark Fedyk is on a mission to correct the way we incorporate empirical research, especially social scientific research, into moral psychology and ethics. For those interested in philosophical methodology, many chapters, if not the entire book, are essential reading. And, interestingly, Fedyk's arguments may extend beyond the bounds of ethics into other fields. That's the good news, on which I'll expand shortly. First, some bad news.

Though the work pays off, it is sometimes frustrating to discern what exactly Fedyk is up to in the beginning and at stops along the way. For instance, for such a concise book, he does not offer a succinct statement of his project or overall argument. One bit of clarification that comes later than I found helpful is his understanding of philosophical ethics and moral psychology. Fedyk makes us wait until Chapter 3 to reveal that, as he understands things:

philosophical ethics is the search for the best-justified structural content for whatever regulative framework is the -- or at least is an -- ethical regulative framework. Moral psychology is, accordingly, the study of the psychological representations and possible enabling knowledge supporting the realization of an ethical regulative framework. Defined thus, moral psychology and philosophical ethics are autonomous but interdependent areas of inquiry. (66, emphasis his)

To makes sense of this, Fedyk lays out the following:

  1. Norms are inherently public rules.
  2. Regulative frameworks are defined by their structural content, which is a cluster of norms.
  3. All regulative frameworks,  . . .  have both physical presuppositions and psychological representations.
  4. The physical presuppositions of a regulative framework are those capacities, abilities, and traits that a population of humans must have in order to realize the regulative framework.
  5. The psychological representation of a regulative framework is the knowledge that must be grasped in order to realize the relevant regulative framework.
  6. When regulative frameworks are realized by groups of people, there may also be different kinds of enabling knowledge that some or other of these people have, and these explain differences in the competence with which they realize the relevant norms. (64, his emphasis)

Though the definitions make sense, they are especially non-standard.

Similarly, Fedyk's tendency to get sidetracked by lengthy explications of, for instance, the potential impact of his model before we have encountered it or had time to digest significant portions of his view. At other times, Fedyk's discussion seems to momentarily drop the chapter's set up as it unfolds.[1] Finally, the entire book is beset by so many editing errors it's like reading a late-stage rough draft.

Still, as I said, the work is worth it. Fedyk focuses on two prominent approaches to incorporating empirical research into philosophical ethics. First, he focuses on attempts to explain "moral behavior -- or, at least, certain generic patterns of cooperation" by relying on facts about evolutionary biology and "biological reasoning" (44). He argues that many of those doing this sort of work mistakenly make predictive use of ultimate explanations. As Fedyk understands things, to make Predictive Use of Ultimate Explanations involves:

Formulating a scientifically plausible ultimate explanation for some pattern of behavior B, and then predicting the existence of a specific, discrete proximate mechanism on nothing more than the grounds that the proximate mechanism is a possible behavior generator for B. (34)

Fedyk's main objection is that this likely falls foul of the entrenched:

Mayr's Lemma: It will not generally be possible to infer which proximate explanation of some pattern of behavior is true from a confirmed ultimate (or structural) explanation of the pattern; and it will not generally be possible to infer which ultimate explanation is true from a confirmed proximate explanation.

As Fedyk explains, Mayr's Lemma is supported by the fact that "there will be multiple different behaviorally equivalent, scientifically plausible proximate explanations that are compatible with the relevant ultimate explanation, and knowing only that a pattern of moral behavior is adaptive will provide no guidance about which, if any, of these proximate explanations is true" (44). This suggests that researchers need more than knowledge of evolutionary biology and reasoning to successfully describe and explain the psychological underpinnings of ethical behavior. Fedyk's project is partly motivated by that need.

For me, the chief excitement of this chapter lies in Fedyk's examples of Mayr's-Lemma violators, which include E. O. Wilson, Martin Daly, Margo Wilson, Daniel Krebs, Richard Joyce, Joshua Greene, and Jonathon Haidt. Each, Fedyk argues, pairs a scientifically plausible ultimate explanation with a compatible scientifically plausible proximate explanation and infers that the latter is true. Fedyk's careful analysis here makes his point shine brightly. Furthermore, it makes clear that those working in other fields might need to rethink their use of ultimate-explanations arguments as well. The common denominator is, of course, the naturalistic or naturalizing nature of the work. Indeed, Fedyk's critique is a thoroughly naturalistic critique of naturalist approaches by a committed naturalist. As a naturalist, Fedyk simply wants philosophers to do naturalism correctly, or at least more accurately. Part of doing it correctly is abiding by Mayr's Lemma.

Take, for instance, those theorists who are deeply interested in Edward Craig's (1990) seemingly overlooked work on social epistemology and who argue that we seem to form beliefs for a purpose.[2] Hence, roughly, knowledge appears to serve a function. These theorists go on to offer scientifically plausible, proximate explanations for using knowledge to fulfill that function which cites one or two discrete mechanisms that, plausibly, generated that behavior. Similarly, Timothy Williamson (2008) offers a proximate explanation that cites the use of psychological simulation to reason about counterfactual propositions.[3] Finally, take teleosemantics, which is, roughly, a family of views according to which meaning serves an evolutionary purpose.[4] It would be surprising if all of the work in these areas were immune to Fedyk's critique. It would be especially interesting to see the extent to which Fedyk's Mayr's-Lemma-based concerns translate into difficulties for that work.

Importantly, Fedyk's discussion of Mayr's Lemma and the research programs he thinks violate it only spans a single chapter in his book. Thus, it would make an excellent addition to an upper level course.

The other type of empirical approach Fedyk critiques involves canvasing adults' deontic judgments about moral decision making, which he refers to as ADJDM-Moral Psychology. Fedyk describes the ADJDM program in the following way:

The most commonly used method in contemporary moral psychology consists of asking people  . . .  for judgments about hypothetical moral dilemmas. Conclusions about how the mind implements moral cognition are then extrapolated from any patterns in the sampled judgments that can be associated with patterns in the details of the dilemmas themselves  . . .  The judgments are also standardly called "moral intuitions". . . (92)

Fedyk cites a compound problem for ADJDM. According to him, none of the core concepts of any theory of philosophical ethics refers to an actually realized phenomenon. But, he argues (a) the sort of external validity that ADJDM is (and should be) after and (b) the projectability that must underwrite ADJDM's more interesting conclusions require that the core concepts of philosophical ethics refer to some actually realized phenomena. Fedyk identifies two strategies available to ADJDM theorists: (1) redefine the core concepts of philosophical ethics so that they do refer, or (2) argue that they're testing a novel philosophical ethical theory. Fedyk rejects each. He concludes that ADJDM is doomed to render moral psychology inconsilient with philosophical ethics.

According to Fedyk, the first strategy fails. He argues that the redefinitions of utilitarian thought and deontologic thought which ADJDM theorists appeal to are too extreme, insofar as they erroneously collapse all utilitarian and deontological patterns of thought into just a single pattern respectively. Fedyk goes to argue that the second strategy fails due to the fact that we must test theories that are evidentially supported, but the theories developed by ADJDM theorists do not enjoy the requisite evidential support. Hence, Fedyk concludes both strategies fail. He extends his critique to those drawing metaethical conclusions based on their ADJDM research project's findings.

Again, Fedyk takes on some of the most prominent names in so-called ADJDM. And, his analysis is persuasive. Of course, we should wonder whether Fedyk has correctly identified the best explanation for inevitable inconsilience between philosophical ethics and moral psychology. We should also wonder whether there is, in fact, inconsilience, and whether it's inevitable, if there is. Still, Fedyk makes a strong case for his conclusion, which, if correct, puts a significant pressure on ADJDM theorists. Hence, everyone interested in ADJDM research or philosophical methodology more broadly should study this chapter (i.e. Chapter 5).

In Chapter 6, Fedyk argues that moral psychology and philosophical ethics should be consilient by attending to what he sees as the most significant challenge to that position -- namely, moral dumbfounding. He quotes ADJDM practitioners: "moral dumbfounding occurs when individuals make moral judgments that they confidently regard as correct, but then cannot provide a general moral principle that accounts for their specific judgment" (Cushman, Young, and Greene 2010; quoted, 118). Roughly, according to Fedyk, the concern is that moral dumbfounding gives those interested in studying philosophical ethics in order to help us make better moral judgments good reason to give up philosophical ethics and focus only on moral psychology. Hence, Fedyk's targets should just shrug at his conclusion that their work is inconsilient with philosophical ethics.

Fedyk's response to the moral dumbfounding concern is fairly straightforward:

It really should be no surprise that in the moral domain judgment and justification can come apart, since they come about in just about every other domain as well. The challenge for proponents of the reality of moral dumbfounding, thus, is not to show that sometimes people are dumbfounded about moral problems, but instead, to show that people are categorically worse at justifying their moral judgments then [sic] they are in other domains  . . .  moral dumbfounding qua psychological construct has not been sufficiently well operationalized for it to be used as a scientific coding construct (119-120).

Despite my basic agreement with Fedyk and my admiration for the simplicity of his argument, I have two main concerns regarding this chapter. First, refuting the moral dumbfounding objection to philosophical ethics doesn't seem to show that moral psychology should help us do philosophical ethics. Recall that the upshot of the moral dumbfounding objection, roughly, is that philosophical ethics is basically a waste of time. So, to refute the objection is to show only that the moral dumbfounding objection to philosophical ethics does not demonstrate that philosophical ethics is a time waster. Thus, it remains to be seen whether there are other reasons to think philosophical ethics a waste. And, none of this speaks to whether moral psychology should be consilient with philosophical ethics.

Second, even if refuting the moral dumbfounding objection did show that moral psychology should be consilient with philosophical ethics, it seems it would only offer partial support. Seemingly, Fedyk needs to demonstrate that there is no way to scientifically code moral dumbfounding sufficiently well in order to use it as a scientific coding construct. Without that piece, his argument remains incomplete.

Fedyk names his model for maintaining consilience between moral psychology and philosophical ethics The Causal Theory of Ethics (CTE). The name is misleading primarily because it is not an ethical theory in the traditional sense. Rather, it is composed of a set of constraints that Fedyk argues should be adhered to by those who offer descriptive theories about the "normative structure of different human populations" (135). Seemingly, the theory is deemed a causal theory because it focuses on providing a framework that should be used to uncover which social mechanisms cause good and valuable outcomes and which don't.

One main difference between Fedyk's model and the models that he critiques in the first six chapters of his book are their goals. The goals of the models he critiques tend toward discovering the answer to questions about how humans reason or fail to reason about what to do, and how humans developed moral attitudes. Alternatively, Fedyk's model is for those invested in discovering why certain norms tend to take priority across various contexts. It's curious, then, why Fedyk doesn't simply argue that the goals of current moral psychology programs are flawed.

Fedyk's model is fairly straightforward. The model directs us to begin by studying behavior patterns of humans in a particular context. This stands in stark contrast to the ADJDM model, which seems to direct us to begin by defining what moral reasoning/thought is for general moral theories. And, rather than eliciting deontic judgments from test subjects, after studying patterns of human behavior in particular circumstances, Fedyk's model directs us to identify the norms at play, determine which belong to which regulative framework, determine which of those frameworks take priority (i.e. are ethical regulative frameworks), study why those frameworks take priority, and use those studies to inform philosophical ethics.

Whether Fedyk's critiques of current practices in moral psychology are accurate or, if accurate, support adopting his approach, his model is clearly valuable for generating information about which norm clusters, when followed, produce "good and desirable outcomes." Unfortunately, I do not yet see how that model will inform philosophical ethics, even on his conception of philosophical ethics as a "search for the best-justified structural content for whatever regulative framework is the -- or at least is an -- ethical regulative framework" (66).

Fedyk uses concrete examples to clarify how his model can help answer hard questions in moral psychology, as well as aid descriptive moral psychology in the pursuit of its goals. His examples are well chosen insofar as they demonstrate the model he's proposing and are independently interesting. Further, they're not just examples of individuals carrying out social scientific projects. Fedyk's example of Diana Baumrind's (1964) critique of the ethical standards set by the American Psychological Association is more familiar in terms of what many working in applied ethics do -- namely, use empirical information to support a premise or two in order to advance a normative thesis.

Fedyk's discussion of how his model can help us incorporate empirical information into descriptive moral psychology and normative moral psychology is illuminating, novel, and provocative. Unfortunately, it remains unclear how his model sheds light on how to use findings in the social sciences to develop or support normative ethical theories. Even if we take his understanding of what philosophical ethics is, Fedyk does not demonstrate how employing the methodology he advocates leads us to its goal. Is it just the norms within a particular, local context that are to have priority? That would be odd, since we can always wonder whether they should have priority. Indeed, that seems to be a central concern animating much of traditional ethical theory. Is the best-justified structural content simply that set of norms that brings about good and valuable ends, then? That would be odd as well, since non-consequentialists will likely balk at the idea that to be best-justified is to be a (reliable) producer of good and valuable ends. Hence, I suspect that the concern Fedyk levels at ADJDM theorists is a charge that one could level at him, insofar as he seems to achieve consilience between moral psychology and philosophical ethics, if he does at all, simply by redefining what most philosophers studying ethics are up to.

In the end, then, Fedyk doesn't offer a new ethical theory, and he might also fail to offer a model that shows how to incorporate empirical findings into the questions that animate ethical theorizing. Still, to be fair, it seems his interests simply lie elsewhere. Fedyk is interested in methodology. His concern is that the methods employed by many prominent moral psychologists are flawed. Fedyk seeks (a) to bring those flaws to light and (b) construct a new method for scientifically interrogating our world. In this Fedyk succeeds. And, his successes there alone make his work important for all those interested in philosophical methodology.

[1] This very clearly occurs in Chapter 5. The main idea in the set up seems to be that the only two strategies available for those practicing current moral psychology are losing strategies.  But, as the chapter unfolds, Fedyk appears to argue that current moral psychologists fall foul of at least one of three principles of empirical research.  To be fair, the principles are loosely related to the argument set up.  Still, it’s unnecessarily confusing even on several passes.

[2] Craig, Edward. 1990. Knowledge and the State of Nature. Clarendon Press.

[3] Williamson, Timothy. 2008.  The Philosophy of Philosophy. Wiley-Blackwell.

[4] See, e.g., Millikan, Ruth. 1984. Language, Thought, and Other Biological Categories. MIT Press.