The Solitary Self: Darwin and the Selfish Gene

Placeholder book cover

Mary Midgley, The Solitary Self: Darwin and the Selfish Gene, Acumen, 2010, 154pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844652532.

Reviewed by James Krueger, University of Redlands


Mary Midgley begins The Solitary Self by observing that Darwin "is now widely credited -- or blamed -- as the source of the strange, drastic form of individualism that is current today" (1). As a critic of that form of individualism, she seeks to save Darwin from such an association. Rather than Darwin, it is contemporary "Darwinism", as advocated by Richard Dawkins in particular, that she indicts. That view, she argues, is the heir of an intellectual tradition that runs from Hobbes through Thomas Huxley. It encounters wide problems, both scientific and philosophical, and should not be confused with Darwin's own more careful views. In part through returning to Darwin, then, we can find a more defensible understanding of human nature. Rather than assuming "that we fully understand the institutions we have now and merely speculat[ing] about their evolutionary cause, Darwin grapples with real contemporary issues about our moral constitution." Thus, he "can paint a picture of our social nature that is both shrewd and original, a picture that fits better both with evolutionary considerations and with actual human behavior than those we are most familiar with today" (17).

It is difficult to give any quick summary of the complex interrelated series of arguments found in this work. In many ways, the book is itself a summary. Faced with the choice of presenting us with a full and detailed discussion or just a "sketch of the scene," she has, as she readily admits, given us just the latter (9). There is much to commend in that choice. It leaves us with a very short work that highlights the connections between biological, socio-political, and philosophical developments covering several hundred years of history. It emphasizes the importance of a proper understanding of that historical context for contemporary debates, and attempts to both criticize and develop a defensible alternative. It does all this and still finds space for a number of insightful and provocative asides (such as one on the origins of biblical literalism, see 95-96). In brief, it is a short work of uncommon breadth, one that challenges even while many of the particular arguments have a familiar ring.

Of course, offering just a sketch has its drawbacks. Those who defend the various positions Midgley seeks to undermine will, no doubt, protest that her discussions amount to unfair caricature (as Dawkins seems to frequently assert in the face of criticism). It is certainly true that many of the arguments she advances against him are already well known. Roughly, she accuses him of committing three errors, accepting: 1) an objectionable methodological reductionism, one that assumes "it is always more scientific to consider separate components than the larger wholes to which they belong" (19); 2) an objectionable form of biological reductionism, where it is believed that "the entity truly in charge of life [is] the gene, which [is] somehow more real than the organism it [belongs] to" (19); and 3) an objectionable form of psychological reductionism, where selfishness is taken to be "a single ruling motive, one that dominates all others" (28). Again, these charges are familiar, as are the responses that have been offered. Nonetheless, Midgley ably summarizes a wide range of arguments (such as those concerning group selections or those defending the independence of biology from other sciences) in pressing her case.

Ultimately, her aim is to contest the third of these errors (and the particularly extreme version of individualism that comes with it). There is, of course, no shortage of passages where Dawkins appears to endorse such a view. As Midgley points out, he does say, more or less emphatically, "a predominant quality to be expected in our genes is ruthless selfishness. This general selfishness will usually give rise to selfishness in individual behavior [and any possible exceptions to this are negligible]" (5-6, the bracketed text is Midgley's[1]). Nevertheless, responses to this charge in particular are many. For example, Dawkins himself has pointed to other passages where he has claimed we have "the chance to upset" the selfish designs of our genes, "something that no other species has ever aspired to do." (TSG, 3) So while "disinterested altruism" is described as "something that has no place in nature" and as having "never existed in the history of the world" he still suggests that "We, alone on earth, can rebel against the tyranny of the selfish replicators" in order to bring it about. (TSG, 201) Thus he does not believe that we are doomed to selfishness. (See TSG, 267-8.) At the same time, however, we do not need this seemingly radical (unnatural?) form of (true?) altruism to arrive at a cooperative society; our ability to reason and exercise foresight, something beyond the ability of mere replicators, allows us to "see the long-term benefits of participating in a 'conspiracy of doves', and we can sit down together to discuss ways of making the conspiracy work." (TSG, 200) In this way, immediate ruthless selfishness can be traded for a longer-term self-interest. We can and do cooperate, because our brains allow us to calculate over the long term.

Here, Midgley contends that neither of these options is entirely satisfactory. We are left either to build on enlightened self-interest as a way to mitigate the negative effects of unending direct competition between individuals (this is where she argues Dawkins is, essentially, a Hobbsian thinker), or we have to believe in the possibility of teaching genuine altruism due to some supernatural power we possess (as genuine altruism has "no place in nature"). The former, far from disputing claims of innate selfishness, in fact requires it. As for the latter, the metaphysical oddity of explaining where this altruism springs from (if it is not from nature) is noted (29), but here again the case is largely familiar (as are Dawkins's denials; see, for example, TSG 331-332.).

Throughout these discussions, Midgley also seeks to undermine the idea that the Darwinist position is the natural outgrowth of evolutionary thinking. Rather, she contends, it arises from a particular misreading of Darwin, an obsessive focus on natural selection (and a particular understanding of natural selection at that). On such views, Darwinism is regarded as little more than natural selection, and the driver of natural selection just is competition between individuals (or ultimately genes). Thus, the views of Thomas Huxley have come to dominate contemporary thinking, "inflating and dramatizing this competitive process into a cosmic force" (100). The paradigmatic example here is Dennett, whose boyish interest in the possibility of a universal acid finds new life in the belief that natural selection constitutes a theory with many analogous properties, i.e., it "eats through every traditional concept."[2] Here Midgley urges us to refuse to accept that any single idea should have such pretensions to universality. More pointedly, she contends examples of cooperation in nature are easy to find, running from organelles that were once independent organisms and banded together to form eukaryotic cells, to the microbes in our gut that are so essential to proper digestion (6). Dennett and other Darwinists can "insist this is all just wily pretence" if they wish, Midgley observes, but in so doing their "myth-making intention surely becomes obvious" (7).

In the end, I doubt committed partisans to the Darwinist cause will be much swayed by these critiques. As noted, many of the arguments are familiar and they are presented in short form. But in deciding to give us a summary, Midgley has pitched her argument not to the true believers, but rather at those who might accept individualism and an essentially competitive image of humanity on the basis of the shaky evidence they provide. Her aim is to sway readers of Dawkins who are "too cowed by the general aura of physical science -- too impressed by the thought that they are being educated in the grand secrets of evolution -- to complain about what is obviously poor thinking on general subjects" (6). To this task the work is well suited. Midgley has urged us to take a wider view, to recognize the limits of what biology (and any other field for that matter) can accomplish on its own, and to not forget the lessons that common sense and common experience urge upon us.

As Midgley presents him, Darwin offers us such a wider view. She asserts that he "was so far from wanting to extend natural selection beyond the biological realm that he insisted it was not the whole explanation even within biology" (102). In reflecting on human beings, and our moral constitution in particular, he again differs from those who most vociferously have claimed to take up his cause. Rather than seeing selfish individuals pursuing their own interests in unending conflict with others, Darwin is understood to suggest that our central conflicts are internal, arising from the "difficulty in combining … intellect with a given set of preexisting social feelings" (28). But even this way of putting things misstates the case. Our intellect is not something above or apart from our social nature, it "is not really our prime mover. It is not the inventor of our social nature. Instead, it is the later, benign outgrowth and instrument of that nature" (130). We recognize this if we think rightly about our evolutionary past. As Midgley observes, "the human species did not arise as an isolated miracle but as just one in a wide spectrum of other social creatures. The inborn sociability that these creatures all share actually provides the only possible context in which language could ever have developed" (130).

Thus, it was our social nature, our inclinations towards cooperation and sympathy, that drove the development of intellect, something required to navigate the complexity of that social world. The abstract moral principles that we then recognize are not delivered to us from some alien place, but arise within that raucous milieu of feeling, memory, and even calculation, developed by the need to interact with other creatures with their own feelings, motives, and interests. This suggests an essential kinship with other social animals, even as it reveals how the human condition, given our unique intellectual powers, is transformed. We can recognize certain collections of motives as structured, as constituting reason, not because they are the deliverance of pure intellect, but because they constitute a "pattern, a background system that we are accustomed to refer to when we start thinking" (70). They are, however, just as grounded in feeling, just as expressive of our unified nature, as any other aspect of our selves.

The echoes here are, of course, of Aristotle. Thus, in contrast to Darwinist reduction, Midgley gives us Darwin as holist. Whether Darwin really is a through and through holist, or whether it is simply the case that such a view can find a home even within the understanding of nature Darwin has given us, matters little to the ultimate conclusion she urges us to accept. What is most important is the claim that such a view can still be sustained today, even in the face of contemporary biology. Or, perhaps better, not in the face of, but in fact built upon rich strands of contemporary biology, strands that offer a competing vision to that expressed by contemporary Darwinians.

Nevertheless, given her focus on the metaphorical aspects of Dawkins and Dennett, it is worth noting that one of the challenges for this holism is that of metaphor. If likening animals to lumbering robots, natural selection to universal acid, and genes to Chicago gangsters can mislead us by capturing our imagination and driving our reflection a few steps too far, it would be useful to have a set of powerful, compelling metaphors to express competing visions. This is a problem that Midgley appears to recognize. Her best attempt at correction, however, hardly seems up to the task. To liken the internal life of human beings to a committee does little to inspire (particularly when contrasted with the Platonic metaphor of reason as the charioteer controlling the passions; see 79-81 in contrast to the images discussed at 68-71).

And this is not just a problem of rhetoric, it is one of providing powerful images that can serve to anchor and guide reflection. Perhaps the greatest strength of the Dawkinsian view is not just its ability to be translated into mathematical models, providing a seemingly endless supply of new puzzles to solve, but also its ability to anchor those puzzles in a guiding vision that is both clear and powerful (this is what has made it such a successful meme, to borrow his own language). In many ways, the views that dissent from the Dawkinsian picture remain well-grounded visions of life and evolution, desperately waiting for an idea (or metaphor) to emerge to organize and focus discussion. But, of course, to make such an observation is to fail to heed the lesson Midgley urges upon us, to avoid the search for some single unifying idea, to rest content with the complexity of the natural world and our own nature. Can such a call to avoid the (apparent) clarity that comes from accepting any such single organizing idea ever ring forth with the same power and capture the hearts (and minds!) of many? Or are such views, in keeping with the name of the series that this work inaugurates, of necessity left to be voiced by heretics of one form or another?

Acknowledgement: Thanks are owed to Benjamin Lipscomb for providing helpful comments on a draft of this review.

[1] See Richard Dawkins, The Selfish Gene (Oxford, Oxford University Press, 1989), 2-3, hereafter TSG.

[2] Daniel Dennett, Darwin's Dangerous Idea (New York: Simon and Schuster, 1995), 63.