The Sources of Intentionality

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Uriah Kriegel, The Sources of Intentionality, Oxford University Press, 2011, 271pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199742974.

Reviewed by Eleonora Orlando, University of Buenos Aires


Uriah Kriegel's main purpose is to set the framework for a general theory of intentionality that succeeds in dealing with the tension between these claims: (i) conscious or experiential intentionality plays a foundational role, and (ii) intentionality is a natural phenomenon. He ends up putting forward two alternative accounts of basic intentionality, both flanked by an interpretivist view of derived intentionality: an adverbial theory on the one hand and a higher-order tracking theory on the other. He seems to have a mild preference for the latter over the former, mainly based on the fact that it is more consonant with naturalism. In spite of this open conclusion, the book contains many well-defined viewpoints concerning most of the fundamental issues. I highly recommend it to anyone interested in having a complete landscape of the problems posed by intentionality, consciousness, and the naturalization project.

The author starts out with a clear methodological chapter in which he distinguishes two kinds of intentional states: experiential intentional and non-experiential intentional states. The experiential, which are the only ones with which we are supposed to have an introspective contact, constitute basic or underived intentionality. Those observational encounters allow for the formation of the very concept of intentionality, along the lines of the so-called 'anchoring-instance model of concept formation'. According to it, an observational natural kind concept -- such as, in his view, intentionality -- is acquired on the basis of our observational encounters with some unquestionable instances. Basic intentional states share a common nature defined in terms of the notion of experiential character: an experiential intentional state is a state that has a certain intentional content in virtue of its experiential character. Among the experiential intentional states, he mentions perceptual, emotional, somatic, conative and cognitive states. As for the non-experiential states, they are properly related to the experiential ones, so that they can be endowed with intentionality in a derived way. So, the author's main aim is to account for those two main kinds of intentional states.

The second chapter is then focused on a rigorous and detailed presentation of tracking theories of intentionality, both first and higher-order. According to the former type of tracking theories, an experiential intentional state is one that tracks a property -- its experiential character is defined in terms of the tracked property constitutive of its content. According to the latter version of tracking theories, it is a tracking state that is the object of a second-order tracker -- its experiential character is defined in terms of what it is higher-order-tracked to be tracking. Both accounts arise against the background of tracking theories of mental representation in general and representationalist theories of conscious experiences. As the author emphasizes, they both clearly belong in the naturalistic framework.

The following chapter is devoted to explaining the main drawbacks of the aforementioned perspective and to presenting an alternative, namely, the adverbial theory of intentionality. Kriegel considers two main objections against tracking theories, grounded on their inability to account for, respectively, intentional indifference (which underwrites the failure of substitutivity salva veritate in opaque contexts) and intentional inexistence (which underwrites the failure of existential generalization). In his opinion, the first objection can be met but not the second. On the basis of the difficulties of the tracking approach in meeting this second objection, Kriegel goes on to offer the adverbial account as a theoretical alternative. According to it, experiential intentional states are to be defined in terms of their having the non-relational experiential property of being-intentionally-directed-somehow, F-wise, or in a certain way. But he takes adverbialism to involve a major, insurmountable liability: it is incompatible with a naturalistic conception of intentionality. The chapter ends with a momentous reflection in which both approaches are taken to have virtues and vices: finally, he expresses a preference for the tracking approach, in its higher-order version though, because of its naturalistic credentials.

In chapter four, Kriegel focuses on non-experiential intentionality, which he takes to derive from experiential intentionality. After considering and rejecting three different theories -- potentialism, inferentialism, and eliminativism -- he defends a fourth one, interpretivism. Inspired by Davidson's radical interpretation and Dennett's intentional stance, interpretivism holds that non-experiential intentional states have their contents in virtue of being consciously ascribed by an ideal interpreter under ideal conditions. Such an interpreter is taken to apply a principle of charity. Charity is the hallmark of the existence of a strong asymmetry between the self-ascription of experiential intentional states and the other forms of intentional ascription. Kriegel suggests applying the same kind of approach to the explanation of linguistic meaning, insofar as it can only constitute another instance of derived intentionality.

Finally, in chapter five, Kriegel shows how the two possible general theories of intentionality would look: as initially pointed out, one combines adverbialism with interpretivism while the other combines a higher-order tracking theory with interpretivism.

On the Objections to Tracking Theories

According to Kriegel, the argument from intentional indifference can be refuted by claiming that the properties that experiential intentional states track or are tracked to track are not independent but response-dependent ones. So, looking at Hesperus while recognizing it as Hesperus and looking at Phosphorus while recognizing it as Phosphorus have different contents, since they are taken to track different 'appearance' properties.

The obvious observation to make at this point is that this solution cannot be generalized, since in cases of singular or de re thoughts, namely, thoughts about particular objects, intentional contents seem to be constituted not by appearance properties but by the very objects themselves. Later in the text, when talking about the adverbial theory (pp. 163-4), Kriegel denies that experiential intentional content is ever singular in the relevant sense, and he proposes to understand the allegedly singular content of experiential intentional states on the model of the semantic content of definite descriptions, plus an attribution not of singularity but of particularity. In my opinion, this proposal should be further elaborated. It is not at all clear how it can accommodate the well-known externalist intuitions about content.

As for the argument from intentional inexistence, he takes it to be rather devastating for tracking approaches of all sorts: some thought experiments show the conceivability of scenarios in which an experiential intentional state fails to track, and be tracked to track, anything at all. Paraphrasing Kriegel, tracking approaches cannot account for cases of experiential intentional states directed at either logically necessarily uninstantiated (putative) properties or nomologically necessarily uninstantiated (putative) properties. He provides the examples of Twin-Emorie, who is supposed to perceive an Escher triangle, and of the hallucination of a chimerical color.

I am not convinced by his discussion of this argument. First of all, why appeal to Twin-Emorie rather than talk about the experiential intentional state of Emorie himself? When Emorie perceives or conceives of an Escher triangle -- as well as when he hallucinates a chimerical color or when he imagines a unicorn -- he has an experiential intentional state that can be construed as being of a certain kind of uninstantiated property. Why not focus on his state in the first place?

Secondly, and more importantly, the claim that in the aforementioned cases there is nothing to be tracked, or to be tracked as being tracked, can be disputed. On the one hand, in describing them as putting a subject in relation to an uninstantiated (putative) property, one (need not but) may want to commit oneself to the existence of uninstantiated properties, hence to a certain conception of properties in terms of transcendent universals, for independent metaphysical reasons. In other words, such a position does not have to involve a metaphysical commitment introduced exclusively on the basis of reasons related to the theory of conscious experience, as Kriegel claims. On the other hand, those cases could be described as ones in which the relation involves an instantiated property, with the proviso that the objects that instantiate the property in question are not the usual physical ones. The property of being a unicorn, for instance, could be conceived of in terms of a global resemblance relation among particulars, which may be thought to include, together with concrete physical objects, abstract mythological characters, for instance, and concrete psychological -- imaginative -- objects. At any rate, no particular conception of properties is thereby implied: they could be conceived of in various terms -- as universals ante rem or in re, tropes, resemblance relations, resemblance classes, etc. A bit further on in the book, Kriegel considers a response along these lines -- what he calls 'adopting a peculiar entity strategy' -- but objects that it would involve embracing disjunctivism (pp. 159-60). Setting aside the question of whether disjunctivism is right or wrong, it is not clear to me how the response in question can be taken to be committed to it. Independently of how the difference between perceiving a butterfly and hallucinating one is accounted for, the cases of imagining, or in general thinking of, a unicorn, a chimerical color, or an Escher triangle, may be explained in terms of bearing the relation of being intentionally directed toward the corresponding properties, which could be instantiated by either peculiarly abstract or psychological entities.

On Adverbialism

As explained, the adverbial theory is based on the notion of a state x being directed F-wise, an adverbial intentional property, of which we are supposed to have an introspective grasp. Kriegel offers the following conditional elucidation of the adverbial account:

(a) whenever the state directed F-wise is veridical, it bears the appropriate relation to F; (b) whenever the state directed F-wise is non-veridical, a certain counterfactual is still true of it, namely, if x were veridical, x would bear the appropriate relation to F. (p. 154)

And he points out:

It is important to appreciate, however, that on the adverbialist view the truth of the counterfactual is not the grounds for the state's F-wise directedness. On the contrary, the reason the counterfactual is true is that the property of being directed F-wise has the nature it does. (p. 154)

But it is precisely the nature of the categorical property of being directed F-wise, namely, the basis for the dispositional property of bearing an appropriate relation under certain conditions, that is not at all clear. If anything, it is the truth of the counterfactual -- stated in terms of a conditional relation to a property F -- that sheds some light on the slippery notion at stake.

Kriegel also suggests that it can be understood, among other possibilities, in terms of the idea of phenomenal foreignness: an intentional experience presents its content as being 'other' or 'foreign'. I don't see how this idea could serve to throw light on the specific adverbialist conception of the experiential character: a state x that is conceived of as bearing a relation of being directed at a property F, rather than as being directed F-wise, might also be thought to present its content as 'foreign'. In other words, it does not provide us with an elucidation of the experiential property of being intentionally directed F-wise as something different from the experiential property of being intentionally directed at F.

On Interpretivism

Kriegel makes some remarks concerning Dennett's 'real patterns' that I find confusing -- at least as much as Dennett's original remarks:

Although is not entirely transparent from Dennett's writings exactly what [the role of real patterns] is, the idea seems to be that there are certain interpretation-independent properties whose presence the ideal interpreter detects when it responds in the relevant ways. After all, there is a question as to why the ideal interpreter would respond with R to x but not y. And the answer must be that there are certain interpretation-independent features exhibited by x but not y that the ideal interpreter detects. These are the 'real patterns' that underlie -- are perhaps the categorical basis of -- something's disposition to elicit interpretation. One intriguing suggestion is that the relevant real patterns are patterns of tracking: when x tracks F, the ideal interpreter detects this, and on this basis interprets x as intentionally directed at F. (p. 214)

It is not clear to me what the point of appealing to the perspective of an ideal interpreter could be, if it is added that the interpreter in question must take into account causal relations holding as a matter of fact between physical states of the world on the one hand and psychological states on the other. It is either objective causal relations or the interpretive process based on normative principles such as charity, but not both, that can be taken to constitute intentional contents. And, for interpretivism, it is the interpretive process and its normative principles that should play that constitutive role.

Along the same lines, in the final chapter, Kriegel mixes up the two combined theories in a puzzling way, to the point that the interpretive theory is taken to change depending on whether it is combined with an adverbialist or a tracking one. Accordingly, in the first case, the ideal interpreter is supposed to ascribe contents to the non-experiential intentional states of others on the basis of his detecting their characteristic experiential directedness; whereas, in the case of the higher-order tracking theory, the interpreter is taken to ascribe them on the basis of his detecting their objective causal relations to certain environmental features. Again, why is the ideal interpreter supposed to be constrained by such requirements? Why does the interpretive theory have to incorporate constraints that seem to be alien, and what is worse, opposed, to its core principles?

Moreover, Kriegel´s original purpose is to give a general account of intentionality by combining items that have been presented as belonging in conceptually different and mutually independent approaches, namely, adverbialism or the tracking theory, on the one hand, and interpretivism, on the other. That is what accounts for the claim that only experiential intentional states have an objective, independent existence, while the non-experiential ones depend for their existence on an interpretive process.  By applying the criterion according to which real entities are the ones whose existence is independent of any subject's constitutive capacities, only the former are real while the latter are not. This difference in the ontological commitment underlying the different kinds of intentional states can be more naturally justified on the basis of the endorsement of a very different conception of each one.