The Stoic Sage: The Early Stoics on Wisdom, Sagehood and Socrates

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René Brouwer, The Stoic Sage: The Early Stoics on Wisdom, Sagehood and Socrates, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 230pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107024212.

Reviewed by Jacob Klein, Colgate University


This volume is a nicely focused study of the older Stoic conception of wisdom (sophia) and the ideal of the Stoic sage (sophos). Two of its four chapters overlap substantially with earlier studies by René Brouwer. The new material, which frames these older studies, focuses on the structure and content of sophia as conceived by the older Stoics and on the Socratic background to the doctrine of sagehood. The former topic is important for understanding Stoic moral psychology. The latter deserves more emphasis than it has recently received. Brouwer's book also brings a number of neglected but important texts to bear on his account of the early Stoics.

Chapter One investigates two Stoic definitions of sophia preserved by our sources: sophia is said to be knowledge of divine and human matters (theiôn te kai anthrôpinôn epistêmê) and also a kind of fitting expertise (epitêdeia technê). Brouwer considers both definitions in turn, emphasizing that for the older Stoics wisdom is a system of cognitions (katalêpseis) whose content includes a grasp of one's own nature -- the self-knowledge of the Delphic maxim -- and of one's place within the cosmos as a whole (34-38). A main claim of Brouwer's in this chapter is that the first definition of sophia -- knowledge of human and divine matters -- corresponds to the three parts of philosophy distinguished by the Stoics: physics, ethics, and dialectic. On this account, to acquire sophia is to master these divisions of philosophy, so that the study of philosophy is itself a program for achieving sagehood. A further claim is that the main divisions of philosophy are interconnected and hence that the elements of sophia are interconnected as well. This "interconnectedness" consists in the fact that the Stoics hold "that ethics cannot do without physics as knowledge of cosmic nature" (29) and also, Brouwer suggests, in the fact that the rational disposition of the sage is physically continuous with -- and so literally connected to -- the reason that runs through the cosmos itself (40-41).

Chapters Two and Three reproduce -- almost verbatim -- Brouwer's earlier studies of sagehood and the acquisition of wisdom as the Stoics conceive them.[1] Chapter Two considers "the moment of becoming wise," the point at which the sage acquires the demanding cognitive disposition in which wisdom consists and a transition of which, the sources say, the agent herself may be unaware. Here Brouwer draws on characterizations of this change preserved in two of Plutarch's treatises, especially the Synopsis of the Treatise 'The Stoics Talk More Paradoxically than the Poets'. Since this text is not included in Hans von Arnim's collection of Stoic fragments, Brouwer's close discussion is a valuable analysis of neglected evidence. Chapter Three argues both that the early Stoics -- Zeno, Cleanthes, and Chrysippus -- did not consider themselves to be sages and that later Stoics probably did not consider any historical personage to have achieved sagehood. Both claims are plausible, though the former more so than the latter, in my view. Brouwer convincingly shows that there is little positive evidence for Rudolf Hirzel's suggestion that the early Stoics regarded themselves as sages. On the other hand, at least one source says explicitly that Zeno counted Socrates as a sage, and a few other texts can be read as supporting this. Brouwer acknowledges this evidence, and his final chapter suggests, intriguingly, that the older Stoics may have regarded Socrates as achieving sagehood in his final days -- "late and at the sunset of life," as a phrase from Cleanthes runs (165). Brouwer's systematic exploration of these questions is the best to date.

The final chapter discusses the Socratic background to the Stoic ideals of wisdom and sagehood. Brouwer sees the inspiration for the main Stoic definition of sophia -- knowledge of human and divine matters -- in passages of Plato's Apology as well as in the Memorabilia's discussion of piety and justice as, respectively, knowledge of "what is lawful concerning the gods" (4.6.4) and knowledge of "what is lawful concerning men" (4.6.7). Brouwer further proposes that the two sides of the Stoic ideal -- the demanding nature of wisdom and the extreme rarity of sages -- are rooted in Socrates' search for a form of knowledge that he himself disavows. Here Brouwer's consideration of the Apology is brief. Much attention is given, instead, to Plato's wordplay at Phaedrus 229e-230, where Socrates mentions the figure of Typhon. Brouwer explores a number of early sources that use similar terminology in connection with the Stoics, including Timon of Phlius' lampoon of Zeno as "a greedy old Phoenician woman in her shadowy tuphos" (154), a fragment Brouwer speculatively connects with the idea that Zeno disclaimed wisdom in the manner of Socrates. It is not clear to me that the terminological parallels Brouwer explores in this chapter constitute a very strong case for the epistemic modesty of the early Stoics or make it "inescapable that the Stoics exploited [the Phaedrus] passage" (153). Brouwer's main suggestions are attractive, however. If true, they bring out the depth of Zeno's engagement with Socratic thought.

The study of the older Stoics has suffered from a somewhat uneven reliance on the testimony of Cicero, to the exclusion of evidence that is securely free of Academic influence. A real strength of Brouwer's book is the care with which he handles a wide range of sources. Moreover, one of Brouwer's guiding assumptions is that "Stoicism should principally be investigated as a unified system of thought" (3). This is a fruitful approach, in my view. I share his sense that our sources for older Stoicism, fragmentary and various as they are, are more remarkable for the unified picture they preserve of a common core of Stoic doctrine. The sources dealing with this common core are far from exhausted, and much can be recovered if one is willing to engage in the sort of patient sifting Brouwer's approach exemplifies. The result, in this case, is a nicely coherent picture of the Stoic theory of wisdom, one that emphasizes the Socratic character of early Stoic thought, the Stoics' engagement with Xenophon, and the importance of cosmic nature to Stoic ethics. Brouwer's willingness to range beyond von Arnim's collection yields new and important evidence that supports this picture.[2]

On the other hand, there is a lack of precision in some of Brouwer's claims, particularly in Chapter One. The correspondence he sees between the first definition of sophia and the divisions of philosophy works nicely for two of the three divisions. Physics can be paired with knowledge of divine matters, ethics with knowledge of human matters. I don't see how the parallel works in the case of dialectic, however. Epistêmê is not a mere "element" in the Stoic definition of sophia, as dialectic is an element of the subject matter of philosophy. It is rather the form of cognition that ranges over divine and human matters. There seems to be a slide here from the thought that sophia is body of theoretical knowledge to the thought that its content includes a theory of knowledge. Similarly, though it is doubtless true that that the elements of sophia are interconnected (the claim is loose enough to be very plausible), Brouwer's discussion groups together two very different kinds of connectedness: (a) connectedness among the domains constituting the content of wisdom and (b) the connectedness of the physical basis of wisdom -- the physical bit of pneuma in which the cognitions of the sage are instantiated -- to the pneuma that runs through the cosmos itself. These forms of connectedness are not alike. A further imprecision appears in Brouwer's discussion of epistêmê, which the Stoics characterize both as secure cognition (katalêpsis asphalês) and as tenor (hexis) that is receptive to impressions. These are differing descriptions of the same thing: secure cognition is realized in the tensional properties of the pneuma that is its physical basis, according to the Stoics. Yet Brouwer suggests that these Stoic definitions refer to "two types of knowledge" (33) and, indeed, that the difference between them can be "formulated in terms of different types of epistemologies" (32).

Some of Brouwer's claims are less developed than one might wish. There has been much debate on the role of cosmic nature in Stoic ethics. Brouwer sides with those who think the early Stoics regard physics as somehow essential to ethical theory (24-29). A fact or set of facts can be essential to ethics in various ways, however: perhaps by justifying conformity to the claims of ethics or by being something one must know in order to know the content of ethics. Brouwer seems to suggest the latter sort of account, but his discussion does not extend much beyond a summary of well-rehearsed evidence. Here and elsewhere, a fuller exploration of philosophical possibilities would be welcome.

In sum, Brouwer's book is highly effective as an overview and assessment of the evidence for a narrow but important set of questions about early Stoicism. It offers many insights, and its main conclusions point, suggestively and fruitfully, to useful directions for further research. For instance, I suspect that the Socratic emphasis on self-knowledge informs the Stoic doctrine of oikeiôsis, according to which self-perception enables animate organisms, including human beings, to perform the range of appropriate functions (kathêkonta) that belong to them. Brouwer's account of the self-regarding character of Stoic wisdom is thus plausible and important, in my view. His effort to find some of the roots of early Stoic theory in Xenophon's Memorabilia is also fruitful. Though some of its claims are loosely developed, Brouwer's book will be of real value to those interested in early Stoicism.

[1] Brouwer's "The Early Stoic Doctrine of the Change to Wisdom" (Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 33, 285-315) is the basis of Chapter Two. His "Sagehood and the Stoics" (Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 23, 181-224) is the basis of Chapter Three.

[2] For example, on page 36 Brouwer draws attention to the emperor Julian's comments on the Stoic telos at Orations 6.6.185d-a, testimony omitted by von Arnim as well as Long and Sedley.