The Stoic Theory of Sign and Proof

Stoic Theory

Fabian Ruge, The Stoic Theory of Sign and Proof, Schwabe Verlag, 2022, 166pp., €48.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783796545566.

Reviewed by Reier Helle, Ludwig-Maximilians Universität München


Fabian Ruge’s study offers a detailed account of the epistemic notions of ‘sign’ (sēmeion) and ‘proof/demonstration’ (apodeixis) in ancient Stoic thinking. The goal is to explain what Stoic signs and proofs are, and thus to reconstruct a key part of Stoic epistemology, i.e., the theory of how signs and proofs allow us to grasp something non-evident on the basis of something evident, for instance how we may infer that there are ­­pores in the skin from the fact that sweat flows through it.

In contrast to influential parts of recent scholarship on t­he topic, Ruge is not focused on the history of the notions of sign and proof within the Stoic school; his interest is in their philosophical content, which he takes to belong to a single Stoic theory of sign and proof. Although this approach is not without its difficulties, the emphasis on the philosophical details of Stoic thinking is, on the whole, a strength of Ruge’s study. The book is rich and challenging. It presents an array of densely argued claims and positions, closely tied to the details of the ancient evidence and recent secondary literature. Ruge does not shy away from taking a stand on issues of interpretive and philosophical controversy, or from defending striking positions of his own. For the specialist reader, there is much here that will repay study. The evidence regarding Stoic thinking about signs and proofs is complex and difficult; this is especially true for the texts from Sextus Empiricus, which are Ruge’s main focus. It is a distinct accomplishment of the work that it puts together a carefully organized whole from this material, and brings into view an interesting way to understand the structure and function of a Stoic theory of sign and proof. The book is a good contribution to the literature. However, it does ask quite a bit of the reader. The discussion is dense and technical; ancient Greek is needed to follow the details; and without prior familiarity with ancient Stoicism and the scholarly literature, it will not be easy to come to grips with Ruge’s moves. This is thus a book primarily for specialists. But the specialists who put in the work will be rewarded.

The central part of Ruge’s interpretation is an account of how Stoic signs and proofs allow for a grasp of non-evident facts. Signs and proofs are supposed to do this in the same way: the sign reveals what is signified and the proof reveals the conclusion; indeed, the conjunction of a proof’s premises is a sign of the conclusion (11–12, 100–101). Ruge’s view of how this works is, briefly, as follows: the sign (taken to be a proposition, i.e., an axiōma) and the premises of a proof enjoy a certain clarity and evidence characteristic of the Stoic notion of katalēpsis (‘grasp’); and they provide a subject-matter-specific justification that allows a cognizer to transfer this clarity to the non-evident conclusion of the proof or the proposition signified by the sign. In each case, the relevant subject-matter is certain bodies standing in certain causal relations, and the justification is given in such terms (16–17, 45–6, 108, 123, 130–1, 148). To use a proof or sign, so understood, a person must connect it (appropriately) to something of which they already have a grasp (katalēpsis), and they must, ultimately, tie it to something of which they have a grasp through their own perception (17, 139–142, 143, 148).

Before I unpack the discussion in more detail, let me highlight two striking features of this picture. For Ruge, Stoic proofs and signs are about, and work by, reference to causal relations among bodies. This restriction raises a question about more abstract contexts, such as in mathematics and formal logic. On the proposed view, it is not immediately clear whether and how there could be proofs (or signs), stricto sensu, in these cases. Further, in contrast to a number of previous interpretations, concepts and conceptual relations play no role in Ruge’s account. There are several specific points of controversy here, some of which I will touch on below. But there is also a more general issue. The natural ‘preconceptions’ (prolēpseis) are conspicuous in the surviving reports on Stoic epistemology, as sources of evidence and criteria of truth (among other things). It is clear enough that Ruge is opposed to their involvement in the interpretation of signs and proofs (see especially 108; cf. 148). But he does not discuss the preconceptions directly, and some further clarity on their broader epistemological role and their precise standing vis-à-vis proof and sign would have been welcome. 

The book is divided into four chapters (and a short appendix on signs in divination). The first two are devoted to the logical relations between the sign and what is signified (ch. 1), and between the premises and the conclusion in a proof (ch. 2). Chapters 3 and 4 concern the epistemic status of signs and the premises of proofs, and how one is supposed to be able to grasp a non-evident fact through them. Ruge’s main focus is the evidence of Stoic thinking found in Sextus Empiricus. The book is organized by the aim of explaining the definitions of sign and proof found in Outlines of Pyrrhonism (PH) 2.104 and 2.135.

A sign for the Stoics is supposed to be a true ‘proposition’ (Ruge’s translation of axiōma) that is the antecedent in a true conditional. And in chapter 1, Ruge argues that despite appearances to the contrary, we need not think that Sextus is ascribing the material conditional to the Stoics; we can understand the key evidence in terms of the sunartēsis account of conditionals, associated especially with Chrysippus. Ruge’s preferred interpretation of this account is that the conditional is true if and only if the contradictory of the consequent is impossible ‘with respect to’ the antecedent (21, 34). The chapter also contains a discussion of which conditionals count as proper Stoic sign-conditionals. Ruge takes the view that the so-called ‘commemorative’ signs should be thought of as proper Stoic signs (40–42). And he argues that conditionals that are true in virtue of conceptual relations between the antecedent and the consequent are not sign-conditionals. So, for instance, ‘if it is day, it is light’, which seems to hold because there being light is part of what it is for it to be day, is not a sign-conditional. Genuine sign-conditionals hold specifically in virtue of causal relations among bodies. I will return to this below.

Chapter 2 considers what it is for proofs to be valid arguments. We learn that an argument is valid if and only if the conditional formed by taking the conjunction of the premises as antecedent and the conclusion as consequent is true, and specifically, true by the sunartēsis account. Chapter 3 turns to the epistemic status of signs and proofs, seeking to elucidate the claim that a sign and the premises of a proof must be evident. Ruge argues for a new sense of something’s being ‘evident’. This sense is undefinable but it ‘coincides’ with a person’s actual grasp (katalēpsis) of a proposition and involves the same kind of infallibility as perceptual kataleptic impressions (e.g., 67–8, 76–83, 88–9). So, for Ruge, signs and the premises of proofs must be ‘grasped’, and they provide a grasp of the conclusion/the proposition signified, which cannot be grasped by themselves (and which, in that sense, are non-evident) (14–15, 86–7, 89–91). 

The goal of the fourth and last chapter is to explain how signs and proofs may reveal (ekkaluptein) and thus provide a grasp of something non-evident. In particular, Ruge seeks to determine what it is for a proof to reveal the conclusion, according to the central texts in Sextus Empiricus. This is bound up with certain recalcitrant difficulties: what is the dunamis of the premises of a proof, through which the conclusion is supposed to be revealed (SE PH 2.143)? And how does a proof proper differ from a ‘merely progressive’ argument, that is, a sound argument with evident premises and a non-evident conclusion, but which still fails to reveal the conclusion (SE PH 2.141–3)? Ruge seeks to explain the dunamis of the premises in terms of their truthmakers, which he takes to be bodies in certain causal contexts (16, 109–125, 148). And he argues that what distinguishes proper proof in the final analysis is that it provides a certain kind of justification of the connection between premises and conclusion, i.e., a justification that is specific to the truthmakers of both premises and conclusion. That a proof provides such a justification explains what it is for the premises to reveal the conclusion (16–17, 128–133, 148). Thus, the problem with a merely progressive argument like this,

If one of the gods tells you that this one will be rich, this one will be rich; but this god told you that this one will be rich; therefore, this one will be rich (Ruge 100; SE PH 2.141–143)

is not that it is not sound or that it does not have evident premises and a non-evident conclusion. Rather, the problem is that the justification provided by the premises is too general; the reliability of divine pronouncements is not specific to the circumstances under which the person indicated will be rich (16, 129). This really is a nice solution to the difficulty, and Ruge’s discussion deserves close consideration.

For all its complexity, Ruge’s book is fairly short (ca. 150 pages, excluding bibliography and indices). It does not cover everything—nor should it be expected to do so. However, I will mention a few points that seem to me to be worth further examination. As mentioned, Ruge holds that Stoic signs and proofs are concerned with causal relations among bodies and work in virtue of them; he rejects proofs and signs based on other kinds of relations, most notably conceptual relations. Part of the reason for this is that he is skeptical of the previous conceptual interpretations, and has a different reading of the texts that have been used to support such views. So, for instance, he argues against the conceptual reading of the central text SE PH 2.141–3 (107–108). I am not fully convinced by Ruge’s alternative reading of this text. However, even if he is right about this and that previous conceptual interpretations leave something to be desired, it would have been good to have a slightly more detailed and direct discussion of why the general picture should be accepted, i.e., of why we should think that we cannot have proofs and signs that work in virtue of conceptual relations, and that we should opt specifically and exclusively for causal relations. After all, Chrysippus did apparently count a certain kind of concept as a criterion, namely, the preconception (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers 7.54), and we have ample evidence of its importance within Stoic epistemology.

Moreover, one might worry that Ruge’s view ends up excessively restricting the applications of and bases for Stoic proofs and sign-inference. Two further points will help bring this out. First, it is a key part of Ruge’s account of proofs that they provide a certain kind of justification. The justification in question is supposed to be intrinsically connected somehow to the proof, when it is properly formulated (131–2, 141–2, 148). So, this proof for instance,

if sweat flows through the surface, there are intelligible pores; but sweat flows through the surface; therefore, there are intelligible pores (Ruge 100; SE PH 2.140, 142)

will bring with it, as it were, the relevant justification. We learn from Sextus that what takes us from sweat flowing through the surface to there being intelligible pores and what explains why the former reveals the latter is (at least in the main) that ‘a fluid cannot move through a dense body’ (PH 2.142; Ruge’s translation, 125). A conceptual interpretation can explain the connection between the proof and the justification fairly straightforwardly. For one can say that ‘a fluid cannot move through a dense body’ is a preconception about fluids and solid bodies that is involved in grasping the premises and their terms (picking up on proeilēphthai at PH 2.142, as suggested by Striker; see Brunschwig 1980, 153). Ruge is clear that on his view too, the justification comes with the argument as stated (132). But he does not quite explain how and why that is; and it is not immediately obvious how the story would go.

Secondly, on Ruge’s interpretation of a Stoic proof, one might wonder about mathematical proofs and proofs within formal logic. These are not in any obvious sense about causal relations among bodies and do not appear to work in virtue of them. There are difficulties here of course. Perhaps there is proof within formal logic, for instance, in a different sense of the word (as has been supposed). However, it has recently been argued by Susanne Bobzien—persuasively to my mind—that there is just the one Stoic sense of proof and in that sense, there are in fact proofs within Stoic formal logic (2020). For instance, roughly, when we show that a non-indemonstrable argument is valid by analyzing it into one of the indemonstrables (by means of the themata and the indemonstrables), we give a proof of its validity (in the one and only sense of proof). But such a proof does not seem to be about, or work in virtue of, causal relations among bodies. So here we have one reason to think that Stoic proofs are not restricted to such cases.

On some points, then, I think there is more to be said. Still, there is much that is worth careful scrutiny in this work, and on many details of interpretation, Ruge improves on the existing literature. The philosophical structure is well-crafted, rich, and ambitious. And the specialist will be challenged and exercised by positions and arguments of pointed interest.


Bobzien, S. 2020. ‘Demonstration and the Indemonstrability of the Stoic Indemonstrables’. Phronesis 65.3, pp. 355–378.

Brunschwig, J. 1980. ‘Proof Defined’. In: Barnes, J., Burnyeat, M., Schofield, M., eds., Doubt and Dogmatism, Oxford, pp. 125–160.