The Structure of Values and Norms

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Hansson, Sven Ove, The Structure of Values and Norms, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 314pp, $59.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-521-79204-5.

Reviewed by John Horty, University of Maryland


This book provides a unified account of Hansson’s work on values (or preferences), norms, and their interrelations. Although much of the detailed material contained here appears among the numerous articles published by the author over the past decade or so, the book presents this work as a coherent whole. The overall style is formal: definitions are set out, results are established. Readers who do not enjoy formal work in value theory are likely to find little of interest here. But readers who do appreciate this kind of work would do well to become familiar with Hansson’s results, and with his general perspective.

The first half of the book concerns values, or preferences. Hansson distinguishes, first of all, between preferences among complete, incompatible alternatives, which he refers to as exclusionary preferences, and preferences among compatible alternatives, which he refers to as combinative preferences (Chapter 2). When I choose one presidential candidate over another, I am exhibiting an exclusionary preference, because the alternatives are incompatible; I might also, in this sense, prefer one complete possible world to another. My preference for having a female president rather than a Republican president, by contrast, is combinative, because the alternatives are compatible; in this sense, I might also prefer one proposition — taken as a set of possible worlds — to another, even if the two propositions are consistent.

Hansson’s basic treatment of exclusionary preference is most notable for recommending a remarkably weak preference ordering. In particular, the preference ordering is not required to satisfy even completeness – the idea that, for any pair X and Y of alternatives, either X is at least as valuable as Y or Y is at least as valuable as X. One could imagine defending an incomplete ordering of this sort on the grounds of incommensurability, but Hansson’s defense is more original: he argues that comparison costs must be taken into account in defining a realistic preference relation (pp. 23--25). Suppose, for example, that I am buying ketchup in the grocery store. There are ten brands of ketchup. I have tried three – Brands A, B, and C – and of those I prefer Brand C, so that is what I buy. In this situation, Hansson argues, my choice is guided by an incomplete preference relation. Since I have not tried Brand D, it is not ranked with respect to Brand C. Indeed, a comparison might actually result in a new preference ordering with Brand D ranked above Brand C. But even so, Hansson argues, my current preference ordering is sufficient to guide choice, since the benefit of further refining my preferences among different brands of ketchup is unlikely to justify the costs of comparison.

This decision-theoretic account of preference is interesting, and may well be correct, but it is at least not obviously correct, and I wish it had been defended in more detail. Certainly the account runs contrary to the conventional “revealed-preference” theory, according to which preferences express the outcomes of hypothetical comparisons, which are then revealed in actual choices. According to this standard theory, if a comparison would result in my ranking Brand D above Brand C, then I already prefer Brand D to C, so that D should be ranked above C in my preference ordering, even if I have not actually performed the comparison, and so am not aware of this preference. Hansson is right to point out that it is odd to think of our actual choices as being guided by preferences of which we are not aware, and he is certainly correct that it would be silly to develop a full array of articulated preferences among all the different brands of ketchup. But there are a range of theoretical responses to this problem. We might, as Hansson suggests, work with an incomplete preference relation, refined on the basis of decision-theoretic techniques. But it is also possible to suppose that the alternatives are themselves completely ordered in our preference relation, though the ordering is perhaps unknown to us, and then apply these same decision-theoretic techniques to the discovery of our preferences, through actual comparisons. The choice between these two strategies would require careful methodological reflection on the structure of an overall theory of preference and decision.

After his basic treatment of exclusionary preference relations, Hansson introduces the notion of a preference state, which represents a subject’s preferences, not simply as a binary relation, but as a set of possibly complex sentences about preferences (Chapter 3). Once preferences are represented through sets of sentences, like belief-sets, Hansson then shows how techniques from the Alchourron/Gardenfors/Makinson theory of belief revision can be adapted to provide an account of preference change (Chapter 4). This is new work, and promising.

Turning to combinative preferences, Hansson first distinguishes two different approaches – aggregative and holistic – for relating exclusionary preferences about complete, incompatible wholes to combinative preferences about compatible alternatives (Chapter 5). The two approaches can be illustrated by taking possible worlds as the incompatible wholes, and propositions, sets of worlds, as the corresponding compatible alternatives. According to the aggregative approach, value would attach fundamentally to propositions, the compatible alternatives; the value of a world could be defined, perhaps in an additive way, in terms of the propositions true in that world. According to the holistic approach, value would attach fundamentally to worlds, the complete wholes; the value of a proposition could then be defined in terms of the values attached to the worlds it contains.

Of these two approaches, Hansson adopts the second, defining preference relations among propositions in terms of preference relations among the worlds they contain. (Note that Hansson does not actually use the language of possible worlds. Instead, he introduces syntactic surrogates, which offer certain advantages, but are too complicated to describe in a brief review.) Hansson begins (Chapter 6) by considering ceteris paribus preferences among propositions, based on the rough idea that a proposition P is ceteris-paribus preferable to a proposition Q whenever any world in which P is true is preferred to a world in which A is true that is otherwise as similar as possible (or at least: sufficiently similar). A relation of comparative similarity is introduced, variations are considered, and logical properties of the resulting preferences relations are investigated.

Hansson then turns (Chapter 7) to an investigation of preference relations among propositions that depend on all the worlds contained in a proposition, not just those that are sufficiently similar. The idea is that, in choosing a proposition, you are guaranteed that one of the worlds it contains will be instantiated, but you do not know which. Hansson refers to preferences relations defined under these circumstances as agnostic preferences (p. 95) and relates the problem of defining agnostic preferences to the task of articulating standards for decision-making under uncertainty. He is concerned in particular with extremal standards, such as maximin preference, according to which P is at least as preferable as Q if the worst P-world is at least as good as the worst Q-world; maximax preference, according to which P is at least as preferable as Q if the best P-world is at least as good as the best Q-world; and variants of these.

Here I would like to point out that, by concentrating on extremal standards such as maximin and maximax, Hansson neglects some of the most attractive approaches to defining a preference ordering among propositions on the basis of the worlds they contain – in particular, the dominance ordering, according to which P is at least as preferable as Q just in case every P-world is as least as good as every Q-world. Unlike the maximin and maximax approaches, the dominance approach can actually be justified, as follows: if P is at least as preferable as Q on the dominance approach, and you choose P rather than Q, then you are guaranteed to do at least as well as you would if you had chosen Q, and you might do better. Unfortunately, unlike the maximin and maximax standards, the dominance ordering does not result in a complete ordering on propositions, even if the preference ordering on the underlying worlds is complete. (To see this, suppose that the proposition P contains one world of value 0 and another world of value 10 and that the proposition Q contains a single world of value 5. Then according to the dominance approach, P is not at least as preferable as Q, but Q is not at least as preferable as P either.) Since many of Hansson’s formal results concerning both the logic of preference (pp. 107--112) and, occasionally, deontic logic (p. 161), require a complete preference relation on propositions, it is unclear to what extent these results could be adapted to the incomplete, but perhaps more attractive, dominance ordering.

The first part of the book, on values and preferences, ends with a discussion (Chapter 8) of monadic value predicates (“good,” “bad”) and how these might be defined in terms of relational predicates (“better,” “at least as good as”).

The second part of the book concerns norms and deontic logic. Normative ideas are often represented in deontic logic through modal operators, but Hansson takes them (Chapter 9) instead as predicates of propositions, telling us what propositions ought to be the case, are forbidden, or permitted. In a standard but questionable move, norms governing actions are reduced to normative statements about propositions: for example, “John ought to open the window” is treated as equivalent to “It ought to be the case that John opens the window” (p. 130).

Hansson’s approach is centered around what he calls situationist deontic logic, which deals with norms referring, not to general rules, but rather to what ought to be the case in some particular situation, with some particular set of propositional alternatives presented for evaluation. He notes that the set of alternatives presented for normative appraisal is not determined by the situation alone, but rather by what he calls the perspective on the situation that is adopted: “ ‘perspective’ will be used here as a technical term for that which determines what states of affairs are taken into consideration in the appraisal of a given situation” (p. 135). Unfortunately, although we may understand these ideas well enough in an everyday sort of way, no real theoretical account is provided here of what a situation is, exactly, or what it means to adopt a particular perspective in a situation.

Standard deontic logic is based on the idea that what ought to be the case is what is true in the best worlds. A corollary of this standard view is that oughts are closed under logical consequence: if it ought to be that P, and P entails Q, then it ought to be that Q. As Hansson notes, the principle of closure under consequence is involved in many of the familiar “paradoxes” of deontic logic (Ross’s paradox, the paradox of the Good Samaritan, the Knower, and so on), and so he is determined that this principle, along with the semantic ideas that support it, must be rejected (pp. 142--143). Instead, he develops situationist deontic logic (Chapter 10) against the background of the preference relations on propositions that were defined in the first part of the book; various properties of deontic predicates are defined in terms of these preference relations, and resulting logics are explored.

This work is interesting and illuminating, but I feel that the wholesale rejection of the idea that oughts should be closed under logical consequence is too quick, for several reasons. First of all, other principles, in addition to closure under consequence, are involved in deriving the deontic paradoxes. Second, it is not clear that these deontic paradoxes really are paradoxes, as opposed to mere pragmatic oddities, like the paradoxes of material implication. Finally, closure under consequence actually plays a positive role in our deontic reasoning which it is hard to see how to fill if this principle is entirely abandoned. Suppose, for example, that I ought to repay a loan tomorrow, but repaying the loan tomorrow entails not spending all my money tonight; without some form of closure under consequence, how can I conclude that I ought not to spend all my money tonight? Or imagine that I am told by my church that I ought not to fight in the army, but told by my state that I ought either to fight in the army or perform alternative service. Supposing I accept both of these injunctions, it seems to follow that I ought to perform alternative service; but again, it is hard to see how I could reach this conclusion without appealing to the closure of oughts under consequence.

After setting out the basic framework of situationist deontic logic, Hansson shows how it can be generalized (Chapter 11) to account for some of our reasoning with moral dilemmas and deontic counterfactuals; the formal account of the reasoning involves shifting either from one alternative set to another, or, in the case of moral dilemmas, from one deontic predicate to another. On Hansson’s view (pp. 173--175), a moral dilemma arises in a situation in which an agent is confronted with an ought predicate that is not “obeyable”---that is, one for which no available action will satisfy all the oughts. Here, he suggests that we shift to an obeyable ought predicate, preserving the stronger of the original oughts, if possible. Hansson refers to this kind of predicate shift as a “pragmatic resolution” of the moral dilemma, but I do not see how it is any sort of resolution at all, pragmatic or otherwise. If the original conflict involves two oughts of equal (or incomparable) strength, how could the choice to preserve one of these oughts rather than the other be anything but arbitrary? And why should an arbitrary choice among conflicting oughts count as a resolution of the original dilemma, rather than as, say, simply making the best of a bad situation?

The book concludes with useful discussions of deontic rules and rule applications (Chapter 12), and of Hohfeld-style legal relations (Chapter 13), formalized in the tradition of Fitch, Kanger, and Lindhal.

Although I have some complaints here and there, I believe that, overall, Hansson’s book is an important contribution to the formal literature on normative theory. The first part of the book, on preferences relations, is particularly valuable, and could reasonably be said to define the current state of the art in that field.