The Supremacy of Love: An Agape-Centered Vision of Aristotelian Virtue Ethics

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Eric J. Silverman, The Supremacy of Love: An Agape-Centered Vision of Aristotelian Virtue Ethics, Lexington, 2019, 165pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781793608833.

Reviewed by Jamie Buckland, University of York (UK)


Eric J. Silverman's book is a welcome contribution to ongoing work in contemporary virtue theory. Silverman's overarching claim is that love is the most important moral virtue, and that the goals of love are a partial constituent of every other genuine virtue. Alongside this overarching claim, he argues that a love-centered account of virtue ethics does a good job of addressing a wide range of issues in contemporary ethical theory:

The view addresses how to: understand the concept of the supererogatory, balance commitments in close personal relationships with broader moral concerns, provide cultural flexibility while maintaining an objective view of morality, provide conceptual room for both moral impartiality as well as close personal relationships, understand the relationship between virtue and the agent's happiness, and offer improved action guidance over competing virtue theories. (pp. 2-3)

Chapters 1 and 2 explore the foundational issues associated with Silverman's love-centred account of virtue ethics. Chapter 1 is, essentially, introductory. Silverman provides a neat summary of the project, as well as rehearsing the philosophical commitments that are common to contemporary Neo-Aristotelian virtue theory. The love-centered account of virtue ethics is described as an 'agent-focused' moral theory placing emphasis on the 'deep inner life of the agent constituted by motivations, emotions, reasons, internal construes of external events, and so on' (p. 9), where virtue is defined as 'an excellence of character constituted by a disposition to act and react well, in terms of internal motivations, emotions, and reasons, as well as external actions'. (p. 7) The virtues themselves are understood as excellences of intellectual and moral character, and the idea of fully right action is portrayed as 'action emanating from a virtue, which is shaped by the ends of love, and wisely carried out within a particular situation using practical reason'. (p. 16)

In Chapter 2, Silverman provides a Neo-Thomistic, dispositional account of the nature of agapic love and considers the motivations for thinking of it as the central moral virtue qua an unconditional love for all persons. His definition of the virtue of love is taken from Aquinas's account of caritas and described as 'a disposition towards relationally appropriate acts of the will -- consisting of desires for the ongoing good of persons and desires for ongoing proper bonds with persons -- held as final ends'. (p. 20) Defining love as caritas/agape is said to best capture the nature of our traditional normative experiences associated with love by accounting for a range of both personal and impersonal human relationships, while understanding love as a disposition determined by the desire for the good of the beloved (including oneself) and the desire for a properly bonded relationship with the other -- rather than understanding love in terms of actions or emotions -- has the advantage of rendering an individual's will the locus of love. Although, given that loving dispositions might not be fully within our volitional control, one may still question whether they can motivate authentic loving action. (Pruss, 2003)

While still foundational, Chapter 3 moves beyond the Neo-Aristotelian framework for virtue, and definitional issues concerning love to an examination of a broadly Thomistic love-centred account of virtue ethics. Silverman argues that embracing a number of neglected Thomistic assumptions about the nature of virtue allows us to address some of the central issues in contemporary Aristotelian virtue theory. In particular, that the love-centred approach provides better practical behavioural guidance than traditional Aristotelian systems and has a number of additional benefits over a justice-centred Aristotelian account. For Silverman, justice is 'an inadequate virtue for regulating close personal relationships'. (p. 77) He expands on this idea in Chapter 4, arguing that 'justice is love towards those with whom we have impersonal relationships'. (p. 105) I'll consider this idea in more detail below.

Chapter 3 is the longest chapter of the book, and much of the initial stages are spent relaying the central aspects of Aquinas's virtue system: happiness as the telos of human nature, the theological virtues, the cardinal virtues, and the idea that love shapes the telos of all genuine virtue. Towards the end of the chapter, however, attention is devoted to responding to the claim that virtue ethics cannot give practical behavioural guidance due to the fact that the virtues often give rise to competing directives. Silverman argues that his love-centred virtue ethics provides a better account of action guidance than those provided by Rosalind Husthouse (1999), Christine Swanton (2003), and Michael Slote (2003), as well as providing better practical guidance than traditional act-consequentialism and Kantian deontology.

Silverman maintains that an agent 'ought to perform an action that emanates from love -- directly from the virtue of love or indirectly through the guidance of some other virtue that is partially shaped by the goals of love -- applied with wisdom'. (pp. 70-71) While this cannot be said to offer an elimination of all possible conflict, he insists that it offers a better solution to practical conflicts than either Kantian deontology or consequentialism because the consequentialist cannot accurately predict the long-term consequences of her actions and the Kantian cannot mediate between competing imperfect duties. The love-centred approach is said to offer more guidance than Hursthouse's or Swanton's mere appeal to 'practical wisdom' to the extent that one should desire the good of the beloved and a properly bonded relationship with the other, and sits nicely between Slote's account of right action defined exclusively in terms of action that 'comes from good or virtuous motivation involving benevolence or caring (about the well-being of others) or at least doesn't come from bad or inferior motivation involving malice or indifference to humanity'. (Slote, 2003, p. 181) For Silverman, Slote's definition is 'too wide' to the extent that his criterion for right action 'allows an excessively wide range of moral action, and 'too narrow' to the effect that it 'disallows any moral relevance for actions done intended for our own good'. (p. 74) That said, given that Silverman provides a very flexible account of what 'desire for the good of the beloved' amounts to, there is an extent to which his own account of right action is equally as wide as Slote's. (pp. 28-31). More generally, I wonder whether there was scope for a wider discussion concerning the sacrificial element of love and its relationship to practical guidance. For instance, it is unclear how one responds to the agent who desires another's good, and wants proper relational bonds with them, but is wholly unwilling to make the corresponding sacrifices.

Chapter 4 moves beyond these foundational concerns and considers a number of issues relating to love and moral responsibility with regard to a range of both personal and impersonal relationships. Silverman argues that the love-centred virtue ethics provides a balanced approach for weighing moral responsibilities (love should be expressed differently based on relational circumstances), as well as arguing that the love-centred virtue ethics is a 'distinct subtype of impartialist ethics' that legitimises unequal treatment grounded in personal relationships in virtue of the fact that human relationships are morally relevant objective facts about the world that apply impartially and count in favour of universalizable types of behaviour. Unequal treatment on the basis of standing in a certain personal relationship is impartially justified and compatible with love provided the following three conditions are met:

  1. An agent treats a person unequally from others motivated by the existence of a specific instance of a general distinct type of relationship.
  2. The type of unequal behaviour is potentially universalizable to similar situations for all agents and the agent would accept that the existence of such a relationship would be a good reason for anyone similarly situated to act in similar ways.
  3. The relationally motivated behaviours, attitudes, thoughts, and emotions justified by the existence of a specific instance of a general distinct type of relationship are compatible with appropriate loving attitudes and actions towards all persons. (p. 92)

Essentially, relational attributes are employed as an impartially employed criterion for guiding action.

Now, while one might agree that this is a plausible vision of ethics, it's questionable whether it should be characterised as an impartialist approach simply by virtue of a universalizability criterion -- as Silverman notes, differential treatment on the basis of relational attributes is often considered the paradigm case of partial treatment. This may be because I do not see the need to 'reconcile' impartial morality with personal relationships in the manner that Silverman does. Rather, the relevant issue concerns how one understands the demands of impartial benevolence, and this seems as much an issue for the love-centered approach as it does for anyone else. Moreover, it's clear that both partial and impartial reasons can be subjected to the same universalizability criterion. Indeed, contemporary virtue theorists may regard impartiality itself as a virtue, but this will feature alongside partial virtues such as loyalty.

Silverman suggests that one way of understanding how love features in impersonal relationships is to understand love in terms of justice (although later on Aquinas's account of misercordia is used to account for how one should love culturally distant strangers (p. 107-108)), but there are practical issues concerning the demands of impersonal justice for which love does not seem a plausible proxy -- indeed the demands of impersonal justice towards culturally distant strangers might require greater sacrifice and an appeal to impersonal justice than the love-centered account acknowledges. The love-centered account is meant to address

the tension between the moral importance of distant and impersonal and closer personal relationships by emphasising that the ideal loving agent has the same two types of loving desires, responses and attitudes toward all of humanity, but that they are expressed in ways that are shaped by the agent's relationship with each person. (p. 89)

However, in terms of providing solid practical guidance between the demands of virtuous close loving relationships and loving impersonal relationships, there does not seem to be a mediating factor beyond an appeal to practical wisdom.

Having provided an examination of agape/caritas as a virtue and its implications for personal character, in the first part of Chapter 5 Silverman seeks to explain how the love-centered account of virtue ethics can be applied consistently cross-culturally. He argues that virtue ethics is no more vulnerable to the charge of cultural relativism than consequentialism or deontology, and that the love-centered approach does a better job of accommodating cultural diversity than its rivals in virtue of its central emphasis on the value of love. The second part of the chapter explores, endorses, and criticises some central elements of MacIntyre's After Virtue, ultimately suggesting that, while MacIntyre offers a helpful account of the relationship between virtues and culture in terms of practices and traditions, it says little about advocating specific virtues in particular, and cannot avoid an 'unacceptable degree of cultural relativism'. (p. 130) The versatility of the love-centered approach, on the other hand, is demonstrated via a comparison of how the older-brother-younger-brother relationship differs in contemporary, Western egalitarian cultures from that of Confucian culture. While the role of brother is an intimate relationship in both cultures, in Western culture the older-brother-younger-brother relation is informal and broadly egalitarian. In Confucian culture, however, the younger brother is expected to display deferential respect towards his elder brother. While significantly different, then, Silverman's idea is that love can function as a 'corrective criterion' to both cultures. (p. 124) Within the Confucian context, love can provide greater resources for protection of the younger brother, while, within the egalitarian culture, love can direct the brotherly relationship towards mutual care. The broader claim is that there are a range of relationships that are not only compatible with a love-centered virtue ethic, but that can also be improved by it.

In the final chapter, Silverman explains how his love-centered account of ethics both coheres with and compliments historical and contemporary accounts of humans qua social and rational animals. Building on Aristotle's definition of humans qua rational animals, Silverman rejects what he refers to as Aristotle's 'overly independent view of human nature' and defends the idea that humans are best understood as rational relational animals in virtue of the foundational role sociality plays in human life. He also spends some time rejecting the need for a MacIntyre-influenced metaphysical anthropology. This all has significant implications for how Silverman understands ethics: 'If sociality plays a foundation role in human life and nature, then ethics ought to value human social nature and grant sociality a similarly central role in moral life'. (p. 142) Given the role sociality plays in human life and the enculturatedness of love's relationships, a love-centered account of virtue ethics captures best the value of the relational bonds in human life. Indeed, Silverman insists his idea of a 'moral saint' is compatible with an 'attractive real human life marked by personal projects, relationships and the opportunity to flourish'. (p. 138)

Silverman has produced a very readable, welcome, and commendable defence of a love-centered account of virtue ethics. Alongside the more theoretically philosophical discussions of the nature of love, the is-ought distinction, Aquinas, and MacIntyre's After Virtue and Dependent Rational Animals, there are interesting references to Shakespearian literature, as well as thoughtful discussions of Classical Greek, Roman, and Chinese philosophy. While these discussions are often brief, they are certainly catalysts for the reader to pursue these ideas more thoroughly. Aside from the minor points I have raised above, I have to say that I found much to agree with here. This book is an enjoyable and thought-provoking read.


Hursthouse, Rosalind. 1999. On Virtue Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Pruss, Alexander. 2003. One Body. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.

Slote, Michael. 2003. Morals from Motives. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Swanton, Christine. 2003. Virtue Ethics: A Pluralistic View. Oxford: Oxford University Press.