The Suspicion of Virtue: Women Philosophers in Neoclassical France and Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century

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Conley, John J., S.J., The Suspicion of Virtue: Women Philosophers in Neoclassical France, Cornell, 2002, 240pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 080144020.

Broad, Jacqueline, Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge, 2003, 204pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 052181295X.

Reviewed by Margaret Atherton, University of Wisconsin, Milwaukee


Both of these books constitute very welcome additions to the small but growing literature on women philosophers in the Early Modern Period. Both provide detailed and well-informed studies of a number of different women. Conley’s book discusses five salonistes flourishing during the reign of Louis XIV in France (1643-1715): Mme. De Sablé, Mme Deshoulières, Mme de la Sablière, Mme de la Vallière, and Mme. de Maintenon. Broad’s work covers approximately the same time period and discusses one German Princess, Elizabeth of Bohemia, and five Englishwomen, Margaret Cavendish, Duchess of Newcastle, Anne Conway, Mary Astell, Damaris Cudworth Masham, and Catharine Trotter Cockburn. These two books, although in quite different fashions, demonstrate the ways in which historians of philosophy are recognizing the contributions of women to the philosophy of the Early Modern Period. They both represent a significant advance over early work in this area, much of which was content merely to point with pride at the existence of women before the present moment who could be said to do philosophy. Both Conley and Broad by contrast provide detailed and informative accounts of the texts they are discussing, making good use of the growing secondary literature, and capably situating the women they are discussing within the intellectual and cultural traditions that supported them. Both books can be recommended to students and to anyone interested in enlarging their understanding of the contributions women have made to the philosophical tradition.

Interestingly, each book represents a different view or perhaps a different moment in the assimilation of the work of women into the history of philosophy. Some of these differences can be read off each book’s title. Broad’s Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century promises widespread or general coverage, but concentrates largely on women living in England and doesn’t, for example, touch on any of the seventeenth century women that provide the subject of Conley’s work. The generality of Broad’s title can be justified, however, by the fact that her subjects can be said to have achieved canonical status among Early Modern Women Philosophers. They are the ones of whom most philosophers are more likely to have heard, and the ones that historians of philosophy have more often chosen to write about. And, as Broad’s book makes clear, they have all, in one way or another, established contact in their work with one or more of the philosophers who typically form part of the canon of Seventeenth Century Philosophers as recognized in English language philosophy departments. Thus, Princess Elizabeth was Descartes’ correspondent. Margaret Cavendish, through her husband, formed part of the Cavendish circle, of which Hobbes was a member, dined with Descartes and wrote about both men. Anne Conway, thanks to her brother, was a student of Henry More, and wrote about Descartes and Spinoza. Astell, through her correspondence with the English Malebranchist, John Norris, expressed her views about Malebranche, and also wrote about Descartes and Locke. Damaris Masham was the daughter of Ralph Cudworth, the close friend of Locke and a correspondent of Leibniz. Catharine Trotter Cockburn defended both Locke and Samuel Clarke. These women, that is, can easily be added to and stirred into the history of seventeenth century philosophy, and while this addition to the mixture will certainly enrich our understanding of the period, it will not alter to any large extent our general understanding of the work in philosophy being done at this time or of the nature of philosophy.

Conley’s title, The Suspicion of Virtue, indicates something of the theme that unites the women he has chosen to discuss. He has singled out those among the salonistes who, he wants to claim, have provided grounds to revise traditional views about the nature of virtue and the virtues. Conley has not, that is to say, chosen to foreground those women whose work readily reflects the dominant canonical philosophy of the period. Instead, in choosing as his subjects women who can be argued to provide an alternative account of virtue, Conley also takes it as his task to argue that philosophy can be found in other venues than those that supported the canonical male philosophers of the period. Conley somewhat unfortunately locates the chief venue for supporting the work of male philosophers as the university, since the university played a smaller role in the development of philosophy during the seventeenth century than perhaps at any other time. He is on stronger ground, however, in identifying the salon, a unique institution of the centralized urban French court culture, as an alternative site of intellectual development peculiarly hospitable to women. He is also on firm ground in pointing out that in looking for philosophy among the women salonistes, it is necessary to look for genres other than the treatises or essays in which the men we read today expressed themselves. We have to be willing to include as legitimate sources of philosophy maxims, poems, dialogues and other genres closer to fiction than to philosophical treatises. Conley’s approach to the history of women in philosophy, therefore, explicitly requires us to enlarge our notions of the way philosophy is done beyond the practices of the canonical men of the period.

In order to make his case, that philosophy can be found in other genres, Conley needs to convince us that when we turn to these non-standard genres we will find interesting claims, in this case, largely about the nature of virtue and vice, that will count in some way as philosophy. Conley is willing to accept that he needs to demonstrate that the work deserves to be called philosophy. An important element in his discussion of his subjects is that, in their various writings, they present an argument for their positions. Conley, that is, endorses, at least implicitly, what is probably a fairly well-accepted position, that a claim, no matter what its subject matter, isn’t a philosophical claim unless it is supported by argument. Conley claims, for example, that, in the hands of Mme de Sablé, the maxim took the form of an argument. Unfortunately, Conley does a much better job of showing that the various women he discusses had interesting and challenging views on the nature of virtue than he does at revealing the argument by which the claims are established. He shows, for example, that several of the women raise doubts about the traditional cardinal virtues, such as justice or prudence, by suggesting that they are closely allied with the vice of pride, and he discusses interestingly several attempts to replace the moral virtues with theological virtues. But, at least as Conley presents the work, while there are undoubtedly interesting and cleverly expressed views, I, at least, had difficulty locating the argument behind them. As a contribution to virtue ethics, as Conley claims, I can find a great deal of interesting material for philosophers to work on, but not an alternative virtue ethics as such.

The problem I have raised is not, of course, a reason for claiming that the women Conley discusses are not philosophers, since it may be a problem due to my deficiencies as a reader or Conley’s as an author. But suppose Conley didn’t display arguments because there really aren’t interesting arguments present in the women’s work. What difference does this make? On the one hand, one is tempted to say, not much. These women are still interesting writers, who certainly deserve to be read as important contributors to neoclassical French letters. Without arguments, we might want to say, they are not philosophers, but “philosopher” after all is not an honorific. It should not be seen as denigrating to these women if they are not actually philosophers. But if we decide these women are not philosophers, then it does make a difference to Conley’s basic claim about the place of women in philosophy. Conley has urged that, so long as we restrict our notion of philosophy to the treatise, then women will always turn out to be ancillary to men. He wants to claim that only when we allow philosophy to be found in traditional female locations like the salon, will we find women who are standing on their own feet, rather than serving as footnotes to male philosophers. It is hard not to think that Conley is right about this, inasmuch as we are all, most of us, male and female, footnotes to our greater predecessors. So, is there a problem for our understanding of the role of women in philosophy, if no woman, up to the present, has been among the handful of giants who have achieved canonical status? If the overall issue is the status of women as philosophers, are women more likely to deserve to be counted as philosophers if we do the same sorts of things men do, but perhaps not so well as the greatest, or if we can be shown to do something that male philosophers don’t do?

At this point, it is useful to turn to Broad’s book, since she provides a version of the adding-women-and-stirring method which Conley is trying to supplant. One of the strength’s of Broad’s book is the way in which she is able to show how the various philosophical positions developed by the women she discusses are informed by the intellectual climate of their time. She embeds her women very knowledgeably in the philosophical projects of the seventeenth century. Unlike Conley, Broad’s understanding of these women’s work as philosophers requires that we see them as participating in the philosophical conversations of their day. Broad, however, has another kind of point to make about the way the women she discusses participate in philosophy. She wants to claim that because the women that are her subjects resist certain Cartesian claims about the relationship between mind and body, they can be allied with various feminist thinkers today. Broad is not trying to enlarge our understanding of what it is to do philosophy, but she is alleging that women bring a special feminist stance to traditional philosophical projects.

Broad does several things very well in this book. As I have remarked before, she does an excellent job of laying out the philosophical positions of the women she discusses. In addition, since these women are, in fact, commenting on other work, Broad is very helpful in providing a background to their work, and in explaining the nature of the issues that are being addressed. Broad’s discussion, moreover, shows admirably that the philosophical community within which these women worked was much wider than the one to which standard courses in the history of modern philosophy have reduced our attention. She shows that an interest in the works of women philosophers goes hand in hand with the wider project of enriching an understanding of the period through closer attention to figures now thought to be “minor” like Henry More or Francis Mercury van Helmont, or who are quite unknown, like Catharine Trotter Cockburn’s correspondent, Thomas Burnet of Kemnay. That these women are revealed, not merely as “helpmeets” to the great, but as participating members of a much bigger community, goes a fair way toward mitigating the disadvantages of “add-and-stir.” Finally, Broad is very helpful in comparing the work of the women to each other. She is especially illuminating in showing the ways in which several of the women, most particularly Astell and Masham, can be seen as commenting on each other’s work. We cease to see the women she discusses as lonely freaks and instead see them as members of an on-going philosophical conversation.

This very strength of Broad’s work, however, that of locating women philosophers of the seventeenth century within a larger community, tends to undercut her general theme. Broad is concerned to defend what she thinks can be salvaged from a position put forward by Genevieve Lloyd that links negative stereotypes about women with Cartesian mind-body dualism. Women are said to be associated with the body and with the non-rational, and men with the mind and hence the rational. Broad acknowledges a point made by several critics of this view, myself included , that a number of seventeenth century women found Descartes’ account of the method of reason inspiring, but she wants to maintain that Cartesianism has many aspects, and that while seventeenth century women took a positive lesson from some aspects, they can be shown to have joined with their contemporary sisters in condemning mind-body dualism.

For a number of different reasons, I find myself unconvinced by this claim. The first and most obvious one is that at least two of the women in question, Astell and Masham, pretty straightforwardly endorse the view that the mind’s essence is thought and the body’s extension, and therefore have to be shoehorned by Broad into an antidualist position. But secondly, and more importantly, I don’t think Broad’s claim does justice to the prevailing attitude towards Cartesian metaphysical dualism in the seventeenth century. As Broad herself points out, Cartesianism wears many faces, and Cartesianism penetrated in many different guises into seventeenth century England, the home of most of Broad’s women. Among these might indeed be a certain kind of hospitality to Cartesian conceptual dualism, that is, a willingness to discuss activities of the mind in one vocabulary, while discussing the doings of body in another. But the metaphysics with which Descartes bolstered his conceptual dualism was pretty widely considered to be problematic. Broad herself shows this in discussing some of the sources for various of the women’s ideas, such as Hobbes or More. So, on her own showing, it is difficult to see the resistance to metaphysical dualism she uncovers as having any particular gender-based motivation. That Descartes’s metaphysical dualism was so widely criticized seems to me in the end to cast doubt on Lloyd’s more general thesis that Broad seeks to defend. For the success of that thesis requires us to see Cartesian dualism as pretty generally culturally entrenched, so that it can serve as an explanation for a cultural misogyny. There are other reasons for doubting this, of course, starting with the fact that earlier non-dualist periods were equally misogynist. But surely, and Broad’s own evidence makes this plain, in resisting metaphysical dualism, the women philosophers of the seventeenth century were joining what was a pretty common opinion. Misogynist stereotypes are unlikely, I would think, to be due to a metaphysical viewpoint that never got much purchase.

The parts of each book that I have singled out for critical commentary concern aspects of each author’s attempt to understand the role of women in the history of philosophy. This is a matter that will undoubtedly deserve a good deal more critical thought. But such thought will undoubtedly be helped along by what I have praised in each book, their scholarly and well-informed presentation of the work of women philosophers in the seventeenth century.