The Technique of Thought: Nancy, Laruelle, Malabou, and Stiegler after Naturalism

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Ian James, The Technique of Thought: Nancy, Laruelle, Malabou, and Stiegler after Naturalism, University of Minnesota Press, 2019, 247pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781517904302.

Reviewed by Samuel Talcott, University of the Sciences in Philadelphia


This book tentatively envisions philosophy as a technique of thought in order to "imagine a future" when there is no longer a fracture between analytic and Continental traditions in philosophy. If particular philosophies differ in their methods of thinking, then these might be considered, compared, and debated, no matter how incompatible the philosophical traditions appear. The focus on technique requires for Ian James, moreover, the recognition that all thought be understood in relation to the reality to which it responds. And this means that philosophy must be a naturalism pursued in relation to scientific work. James borrows the image of thought as technique from Bernard Stiegler, a contemporary French philosopher, and the hopeful vision of communication restored from Richard Rorty. The book proceeds along these lines, carefully considering what authors in Anglo-American and French traditions would have to say to each other on the topic of naturalism. The writings of contemporary scientists and relevant contemporary philosophical trends, like speculative realism, are also brought into the conversation, making for an ambitious, lively, informative, and provocative volume that should appeal to many. This review focuses on the book's general contours before turning to questions that the recent history of philosophy raises for the sort of naturalism it elaborates.

James looks to Anglo-American philosophers to define "traditional naturalism" and to four contemporary French philosophers -- Jean-Luc Nancy, François Laruelle, Catherine Malabou, and Bernard Stiegler -- in order to develop an account of "post-Continental naturalism" (a term borrowed from Mullarkey, 2006) that both continues and transforms the traditional sort. Chapter One identifies the different images of philosophy maintained by each of his four thinkers; Chapter Two elaborates an in-depth reading of Nancy's thought; Chapter Three focuses on Laruelle's nonphilosophy and later nonstandard philosophy; and Chapter Four considers both Malabou's and Stiegler's respective ways of philosophizing. These long, central chapters offer fine introductions to each thinker, focusing on one or more central concerns of naturalism: the relation between the sciences, philosophy, and thought; realism and the relation of philosophy and thought to the real; and the relation between thought and the body. James is keen to consider the techniques by which this array of contemporary thinkers addresses and alters naturalism's traditional problems.

The book identifies its four thinkers as post-deconstructive, that is to say post-Derridean, because they were either closely associated with Derrida as "friends, colleagues, or students" or because their work is based on a "critique of some of the impasses or problems of deconstruction" (2). James recognizes that "Derridean thought emerges from the critique . . . of a post-Kantian, phenomenological, and therefore idealist or transcendentalist tradition, which vigorously opposes itself to naturalism and naturalistic attitudes (e.g., psychologism, physicalism, and empiricism)" and will thus not seem a likely source for a new naturalism (2).[1] But, finding that each of these four endorses a realism and materialism, his argument is, "that the thought of each is rigorously and coherently compatible with a kind of naturalism also, albeit one that, as post-Continental, is somewhat different from what has been understood as such hitherto" (2). Although he declares it one "kind" among others, he defines post-Continental naturalism as a "tendency" that cannot be a "philosophical movement or school, and even less a single unitary philosophy" (1). Just as he hesitates to assert that philosophy must be studied as a technique of thinking, he refrains from insisting that this post-Continental naturalism definitively exists. Instead, he adopts this name in order to "assist emerging bodies of thought to find their place within contemporary philosophical debate" (225). James associates the technique of each thinker with a name for the same reason: Nancy with speculative naturalism, Laruelle with axiomatic naturalism, Malabou with epigenetic naturalism, and Stiegler with organological naturalism. However tentative and uncertain such names might be, however acceptable they might be to the thinker to whom it applies, James concludes that, "In using such names, paths for further research programs can be staked and possible further avenues explored" (226). His book poses itself thus as an experimental contribution to a practice of thinking as experimentation.

To better understand how the book experiments with thought it is helpful to consider its use of the prefix "post-," a term James deploys to qualify a wide range of different historical and contemporary forms of thought. Generalizing the use mentioned above, he appears to suggest that what is post-X is what comes after X, is shaped by it and/or critically responds to it. What is post-X remains in continuity with X even if only in the form of a critique. James uses the term, therefore, to name an awareness of historical conditions of possibility or existence that cannot be exhaustively comprehended and which enable multiple, diverging outcomes. This usage, then, is his own way of continuing the experience he finds in Nancy, Laruelle, Malabou, and Stiegler, "an experience in which thought, encountering the impossibility of grasping its conditions of possibility, is exposed to the always excessive singular plurality of existence to which it is nevertheless always already in some kind of relation" (53). James finds "an image of philosophy" as such a limit-experience through his interpretation of the history of Continental philosophy, specifically, "Kantian transcendentalism, phenomenology, and existential phenomenology, as well as their subsequent deconstruction" (10). Besides Kant and Derrida, other key names in James' history are Hegel, Nietzsche, Husserl, Heidegger, Canguilhem, and Deleuze and Guattari. But he clearly undergirds his own image of the history of philosophy through his reading of Malabou, which explores her technique of generating images of philosophy by studying its history as an experience of alteration that arises from the very activity of thinking.

James' reading of Stiegler argues for the importance of understanding thought as a technique pursued without foreknowledge that, likewise, clearly informs the very endeavor of his book. So too, the extensive discussion of Laruelle both argues for the importance of an inaccessible real and its role in shaping thought, and supports the book's many appeals to the importance of the real. James' initial interpretation of Nancy's work, which focuses on the experience of thought as an experience of freedom, of groundlessness, also appears in the tentative way in which he frames his endeavor. His later reading of Nancy's notion of transimmanence undoubtedly shapes the way he brings the four thinkers together without asserting their identity: together they constitute a singular plurality that can only be understood in relation to each other and the history of Continental thought. The prefix in "post-Continental philosophy" is, then, but one instance of the way James brings his readings of Nancy, Laruelle, Malabou, and Stiegler to bear on the structure, techniques, and overall argument of his book.

They are also, then, the source of the techniques that James uses to elaborate a post-Continental naturalism that would communicate with traditional, Anglo-American naturalism and contribute to its reformulation. James is keen to show through readings of Sellars, Quine, and later exponents like David Lewis, that this tradition argues for autonomy in the relation between the sciences and philosophy despite asserting that the sciences alone produce knowledge of reality. Even a thinker like Lewis, who exemplifies strict materialist reductionism, is found to recognize the independence of philosophical thought and the legitimacy of philosophical speculation in the face of attacks against naturalism (8-9). In this tradition, in short, James identifies an assertion of continuity between science and philosophy that, nevertheless, does not subject the latter to the former's standards. James finds in Lewis a specific image of philosophy as a "total theory," an image that is philosophical, not scientific (9). While this image resonates with an image of scientific work as unifying, James argues that it was developed by Lewis and others in relation to both a multiplicity of other images of philosophy found in philosophical debates about science and a multiplicity of other images of science implicit in scientific theories and practices. Thus, in brief, images of a knowledge of the real that would be total, unified, and complete, should give way to images of philosophy and science defined by "a horizon of multiplicity, disunity, and incompleteness" (14). James' claim is not that what counts as real depends upon thought, but that the variability of images of philosophy and science results from the very plurality and incompleteness of the real.

The plurality of the real also underlies his assertion that there must be multiple techniques for encountering and responding to the real, leading to both "a realism of thought and a realism of scientific knowledge" within each of these endeavors (222). Scientific and philosophical techniques, he finds, differ, though they also become entangled and inform each other through the resultant exchanges that are

necessary because philosophy without science would sever itself from one of the most important means of accessing the real, and science without speculative, philosophical, and/or experimental thinking would lack the capacity to imagine and think the real when it comes up against the limits of what it knows. (224)

One of the book's high points is its exploration of such entanglements and exchanges through diverse and sometimes divergent collaborations, discussions, or engagements between each of his four thinkers and contemporary scientists and scientific discourse. Taken together they persuasively suggest that neither scientific nor philosophical work can pretend to any total, unified, or complete understanding of the real, but that both require speculative, experimental thinking about and in the face of the real. But this does not mean that anything goes.

Representative here is his treatment of Deleuze and Guattari and their inheritors. Though others in the history of the Continental tradition are also excluded from James' naturalism, Deleuze and Guattari are given the most critical attention, perhaps because he worries about the contemporary work in naturalism they inspire, like new materialism. The problems, which align their work with traditional naturalism, seem to come down to their interest in experimental creation and what James thinks is their failure to treat thought as arising from a limit-experience, of thinking as an encounter with the limits of thought as such (52-53). This critique is quite surprising given their own assertion that the task of philosophy is experimentation. I suspect some of their readers will be left unconvinced by James' arguments. In any case, here he implicitly attaches another meaning to the prefix in "post-Continental naturalism." If it suggests continuity, it can also indicate the surpassing of a failed technique.

The book raises many questions worth exploring. I was fascinated and perplexed by its uses of Georges Canguilhem (1904-1995), the philosopher and historian of the life sciences and medicine whose central importance in 20th century French thought Foucault argued for. And I am compelled to consider these uses in light of my own recent work on Canguilhem (Talcott 2019). Borrowing from Guillaume LeBlanc's reading, James deploys Canguilhem's work in the 1950s and 1960s to help anchor Nancy's speculative thought in a biological philosophy and thus, ultimately, elaborate it as a post-Continental naturalism. James finds that aspects of Canguilhem's empirical understanding need to be updated in light of contemporary science (82), but that his biological philosophy "remains pertinent and able to yield interpretive insights with respect to current biological knowledge" (84). Thus, he puts Canguilhem's conception of life as material inscription of sense together with contemporary biochemist Nick Lane's work on the continuities between geo- and bio-chemistry in order to support Nancy's thinking and argue for a cosmos in which all matter is inscribed sense. Ultimately, this leads James towards a naturalism in which the material world studied by the sciences remains open to meaningful, qualitative experience. Later, he argues that Malabou's developing epigenetic naturalism has become quite close to this Canguilhem-Nancy position (200) and he notes Stiegler's own recognition of Canguilhem's importance for philosophizing about technique (202). James aligns his own thinking throughout with Canguilhem's understanding of life as resistance.

Canguilhem cuts a strange figure in this book, speaking from the past but explicitly invoked on occasion and discussed at length in James' attempt to outline a contemporary naturalism. In reading his book, it struck me that each of the four figures could be interpreted as elaborating a particular aspect of Canguilhem's work: Stiegler's insistence on the priority of technique fits with Canguilhem's own early insistence on technical failure as both impetus for knowledge and outline of its eventual shape; Malabou's interest in plasticity in the history of philosophy and the relation between thinking and the brain seems close to Canguilhem's own ideas on these topics; Laruelle's complex commitment to the real accords with central aspects of Canguilhem's account of scientific work; and, finally, Nancy's account of philosophizing as an experience that happens at the limit of thought resonates with Canguilhem's own conception of thought, whether scientific or philosophical, as adventure. For each, the experience of philosophy, or nonphilosophy in Laruelle's case, emerges "in the absence of foundation or ground" and "can be understood not just as a specific mode of experience (of limits, immanence, of the default or plasticity of the origin), but also as a mode of experimental technique" (46). Though James does not mention it, Canguilhem developed a very similar formulation through his understanding of the problem of error in Bergson and Alain (Canguilhem 1952). And there is good reason to think that Canguilhem began working out his formulation of an experimental philosophy long before.

Contra James, furthermore, Canguilhem recognized the existence of philosophical schools as associations of individuals bound together by a common spirit, that is to say, character. Such schools are not defined by adhesion to doctrine, but instead the various endeavors to philosophize in a certain spirit, deploying philosophical techniques and inventively borrowing from other practices in order to realize this spirit in the face of uncertain events and unpredictable reality. Canguilhem's school can be characterized, I argue, by a spirit of resistance. What James takes as a tendency, then, seems to me instead the ongoing elaboration of a spirit and techniques that also animate Canguilhem's writings. This does not mean that Canguilhem invented this approach and these problems ex nihilo or that they remain unchanged. It was only by resisting the philosophers through whom he began to philosophize in the first place that he developed his singular approach, in which present realities of all sorts, ongoing histories of scientific concepts, the scientifically informed techniques of contemporary societies, and philosophical work are inescapably entangled.

That Canguilhem's importance for these four philosophers might undermine James' argument for a post-Continental naturalism seems clear in light of his attempt to decide who exhibits this "tendency" and who does not. For Deleuze and Guattari, alongside Foucault, Derrida, and many others from the 1960s to the present, as the book helps us understand, can and need to be read as experimenting with Canguilhem's experimental approach to philosophy. Further attention to Canguilhem undermines, moreover, the claim that Continental and analytic philosophers have been unable to communicate with each other until recently. The extracts published from his "Course in General Philosophy and Logic" (1941-1942), show a clear attention to and critique of logical positivism with implications for the development of his own thinking (Canguilhem 2015, 65-80). While these points do not detract from the value of James' book as a stimulating investigation of four contemporary French thinkers, their relations to technique and the sciences, and an alternative naturalism, they may suggest a need to reframe or otherwise alter the scope of inquiry.


Canguilhem, Georges. 1952. "Réflexions sur la création artistique selon Alain." Revue de métaphysique et de morale, vol. 57, n.2, avril-juin, p. 171-186; reprinted in Canguilhem 2015, 415-435

-- . 2015. Oeuvres complètes, Tome 4, ed. C. Limoges. Paris: Vrin.

Foucault, Michel. (1966) 1994. The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences. New York: Vintage Books.

Mullarkey, John. 2006. Post-Continental Philosophy: An Outline. London: Continuum.

Talcott, Samuel. 2019. Georges Canguilhem and the Problem of Error. Cham: Palgrave Macmillan.

[1] Given James' endeavor, the absence of any reference to Foucault's work on the history of philosophy's interest in the transcendental and its difficult relation the empirical sciences is surprising (Foucault [1966] 1994).