The Tenets of Cognitive Existentialism

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Dimitri Ginev, The Tenets of Cognitive Existentialism, Ohio University Press, 2011, 198pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780821419762.

Reviewed by Jeff Kochan, University of Konstanz


This is a work in the philosophy of science. Specifically, Dimitri Ginev applies the methods of hermeneutic phenomenology in a wide-ranging discussion of the scientific enterprise. For those who fuss over such things, I suppose this makes Ginev a "continental" philosopher of science. Indeed, Ginev apparently views himself in just this way. And yet he also offers wonderfully diverse comments on the works of Brandom, Butler, Davidson, Derrida, van Fraassen, Fine, Galison, Habermas, Hacking, Harding, Heelan, Heidegger, Husserl, Keller, Kockelmans, Kuhn, Longino, Marcuse, Quine, Rheinberger, Rorty, and Rouse. A wolf-child philosopher, raised in a remote valley untouched by the urbane discrimination between "continental" and "analytic," may be forgiven if she fails to notice from Ginev's book that these names are meant to fall obediently on either side of an incontrovertible disciplinary divide.

The "cognitive existentialism" of Ginev's title is meant to contrast with cognitive essentialism, and it denotes the epistemological outcome of a hermeneutic phenomenology of science. The essentialism against which Ginev positions himself is not just one of concepts, but also of the epistemic rules and principles governing the production of those concepts. In Ginev's view, scientific cognition has no essential features of its own, but is instead constituted by the specific modes of existence characteristic of scientific research. The key philosophical move, then, is from an epistemology of scientific content to an ontology of scientific existence, with the latter being touted as an explanatory foundation for the former.

In historical terms, Ginev's cognitive existentialism falls in with various post-positivist responses to perceived weaknesses in the theory of science introduced by the Vienna Circle in their striking 1929 manifesto, an event which arguably marks the birth of philosophy of science as a distinct sub-discipline. Ginev is one of the most ambitious, prolific, innovative, and interesting contemporary advocates for a post-positivist hermeneutics of science, an approach first developed and sustained on the fringes of twentieth-century philosophy of science by such figures as Patrick Heelan, Joseph J. Kockelmans, and, more recently but to a lesser extent, Joseph Rouse.

At the core of the discipline, by contrast, one finds such well-known positions as scientific realism, constructive empiricism, and social constructivism. Ginev rejects all of these as different manifestations of cognitive essentialism. Scientific realists reify theoretical constructions, thereby committing themselves to "naturalist essentialism." Constructive empiricists reduce the role of scientific practice to one of theory construction, thereby committing themselves to "intratheoretical essentialism." Social constructivists deny a place to nature in the genesis of scientific knowledge, thereby committing themselves exclusively to the role of social networks in what might perhaps be called "sociologistic essentialism." What, precisely, is wrong with cognitive essentialism is something Ginev never makes entirely clear. Presumably it has much to do with his own methodological commitment to a phenomenological description of science in terms of practice, and a corollary commitment to the reductive explanation of scientific theory in terms of practice.

This commitment to the phenomenology of scientific practice is something Ginev inherits from the early Heidegger. The evil spirit in need of exorcism here is a subject-object ontology which, when taken as foundational, obliges us to conceive of the subject as a discrete substance in possession of special cognitive faculties. These special faculties somehow allow the subject to bridge over to the object, another discrete substance, and so gain knowledge of it. This picture of knowledge acquisition is lamentably vulnerable to sceptical attack. Heidegger argues that phenomenological inquiry instead treats the subject as a "being-in-the-world," that is, an entity practically involved with other entities within a world, rather than an isolated cogito standing outside a world to which it must then somehow gain access. Transposed to the scientific context, this view has the scientist practically involved with nature in the production of knowledge. The goal here is not to explain how scientists achieve access to nature, so as to then know it, but rather to explain how their ongoing practical involvement with nature gives rise to theoretical knowledge. Cognitive essentialism would seem, on Ginev's account, to explain scientific knowledge reductively in terms of the essential properties of discrete substances -- subject and object -- as well as the correspondence or referential relations which purportedly obtain between features of those substances. Cognitive existentialism, in contrast, rejects substance ontology, instead explaining scientific knowledge reductively in terms of the ongoing practical involvement of the scientist -- construed as intentional agency rather than discrete substance -- with the natural entities populating the research environment.

According to Ginev, Heidegger lacked the courage of his convictions, falling back on theory when he should have stood unequivocally for practice. Heidegger's failure is allegedly evinced in his description of science as a "mathematical projection." This notion of "projection" brings us to the hermeneutical aspect of Ginev's theory of science. Rejecting the traditional empiricist notion that one can gain immediate knowledge of nature through passive observation, Ginev leans on Heidegger to argue that observation presupposes interpretation. We gain knowledge of entities only by projecting a pre-existing "fore-structure" of understanding within which those entities then become constituted as meaningful. This fore-structure is more existential than conceptual, more a matter of embodied practice than of mental content. Interpretation is thus more an existential than a conceptual act. Though Ginev does not explicitly mention the problem of the underdetermination of theory by data, his proposed hermeneutical stance may be viewed as an attempt to address this problem.

Heidegger argued that scientific knowledge follows a "change-over" in the fore-structure of understanding: from a non-thematic understanding of an entity encountered unreflectively in some practical activity (your tongue while eating) to a thematic understanding of an entity encountered deliberatively as an object of attention (your tongue after biting it). Heidegger claims that the former is more indicative of everyday life than the latter. Scientific understanding springs from the latter, when an object of attention is further thematized as a subject matter for quantitative analysis (your tongue studied by an anatomist). This sort of thematization Heidegger called "mathematical projection": it facilitates the interpretation of entities through a fore-structure which includes such abstract categories of measurement as length, mass, location, and time.

Ginev criticizes Heidegger's concept of mathematical projection as being in hock to "mathematical essentialism." The accusation seems to be that Heidegger was uncritically drawing on theoretical concepts when fashioning his account of scientific cognition, thereby losing sight of the practical grounds for all theoretical understanding. Here, Ginev is largely reproducing a stubborn and depressing meme often found in Heidegger studies. Ginev's sole textual support for this criticism appears to be Heidegger's claim that, in the change-over to theoretical understanding, we come to "overlook" the embeddedness of an entity in everyday contexts of practical activity: "Its place becomes a matter of indifference" (Heidegger 1962: 413). But overlooking is not eliminating, and a matter of indifference is not no matter at all. Moreover, just four pages earlier, Heidegger states that "theoretical research is not without a praxis of its own," and suggests that the use of simple instruments is ontologically consequential even in the most abstract of research contexts (Heidegger 1962: 409). Ginev's attempt to foist a mathematical essentialism onto Heidegger is thus insufficiently justified, and this in turn suggests that Ginev's own position may be rather closer to Heidegger's than he currently admits.

Ginev explores different dimensions of the interpretative fore-structuring of the scientific practices which serve to articulate specific domains of research. For example, in the context of a case from the history of quantum mechanics, he presents "visualizability" as a dimension in which specific configurations of scientific practice open up distinct representational spaces in which theoretical objects are translated into visible effects. These visible effects constitute an observable research object through which an unobservable theoretical object might then be "read." So far so good, the scientific realist may think. However, Ginev furthermore argues that a theoretical object can exist only within the configurations of practice which make its visualizability possible. So much, then, for independent existence. The fact that, on this account, the existence of theoretical objects is, strictly speaking, practice-dependent rather than mind-dependent will presumably bring cold comfort to the scientific realist.

In another example, Ginev focuses on the "thematizing projects" which have a central place in the fore-structuring of scientific research. A thematizing project determines the basic ontology of a specific research area. Ginev considers a variety of such projects in the biological sciences, arguing that different thematizing projects open up distinct regions of observable and unobservable objects. He is especially keen to preserve the irreducibility of one ontological level to another, for example, of macro-level holistic phenomena to micro-level quantum-mechanical phenomena. However, he furthermore argues that a lack of theoretical translatability between such research domains does not prevent them from sharing in a relation of "complementarity." If I have successfully understood Ginev's intentions (and I fear that I may not have), he wants to argue that the incommensurability of research domains opened up by different thematizing projects is compatible with the inter-relatedness of practices across those domains. Hence, the radical disunity of scientific domains in respect of their theories is overcome by their existential-practical unity in respect to the everyday research practices constituting those theories.

Ginev also addresses the role of gender as a basic dimension in the fore-structuring of scientific research. He agrees in general with feminist philosophers of science that gender can inform scientific practices in a profound way. However, he distances himself from particular feminist philosophers, like Sandra Harding and Judith Butler, whom he sees as threatening the cognitive autonomy of science through their insistence that scientific practices be understood in social and political terms. This leads Ginev to reject the claim that gender is a social construction. He argues instead for an account of gender as constituted within configurations of inter-related discursive practices, practices which he views as "more primordial" than those generally discussed, in his view, by social constructivists.

Ginev's attempted hermeneutic defence of the cognitive autonomy of science is most clearly demonstrated in his critique of Joseph Rouse. He rather firmly rejects Rouse's efforts to develop an anti-essentialist, naturalistic account of scientific norms, one premised on a deconstruction of the nature-culture distinction. Ginev argues that Rouse is wrong to think that anti-essentialism entails the rejection of science's cognitive autonomy. One might, after all, adopt cognitive existentialism, which combines both anti-essentialism and cognitive autonomy in one neat package. On this basis, Ginev concludes that Rouse "fails to understand scientific practices philosophically."

There appears to be much at stake for Ginev here. In some of the most politically energetic statements of the book, he insists that naturalistic attacks on the cognitive autonomy of science lead to a "false image" of democracy. Democratic societies need autonomous science; otherwise they will become "totally instrumentalized." Oddly, what appears at first blush to be a paean to the autonomy of science turns out to also be a rear-guard action to protect society from "scientification." On the one hand, Ginev objects to the "dangerous" involvement of non-scientists in determining the ends of science. On the other hand, he seems to argue that such involvement, by breaching the steel belt encircling the cognitive core of science, will flood society with an unrestrained scientification. It strikes me that the devil against which Ginev actually inveighs here is the instrumental rationality which so exercises critical theorists. Such instrumentalism cuts across both science and society, and is the Moloch to which Ginev insists neither science nor society should ever be sacrificed.

Indeed, Ginev's debt to critical theory emerges explicitly near the end of his book, in a discussion of Herbert Marcuse's proposal for a "new science" based on an "erotic attitude" towards nature. This attitude, it seems, entails a dialogue with nature rooted in bodily experience, a dialogue meant to reveal nature's "inherent" aesthetic qualities through mediating configurations of scientific practice. According to Ginev, these configurations of practice form a "self-sufficient body," one through which a somatic relation to nature is established. In describing this body, Ginev draws a "heuristic parallel" between individual corporeity and what he calls "transsubjective corporeity." The term "transsubjectivity" is meant to contrast with the intersubjectivity favoured by social constructivists. It would seem that the erotic dialogue with nature is to be felt, as it were, in the transsubjective body of the practicing scientific research community. Ginev argues that this community, given its cognitive autonomy, must take responsibility for whatever attitude it adopts in relation to nature. He appears to himself recommend an erotic, in contrast to an instrumental, attitude. In any case, these provocative considerations inform his claim that cognitive existentialism provides the basis for a "rigorous ethics of scientific being-in-the-world."

Before concluding this review, I should like to briefly defend one of the patches of earth I call home: social constructivism, or, more specifically, the sociology of scientific knowledge (SSK). Like many philosophers of science, Ginev rejects SSK without properly understanding it. He argues, for example, that SSK denies a role to nature in the formation of scientific knowledge. This is false. SSK views scientific knowledge as the combined effect of both natural and social causes (see, for example, Bloor 2004). Indeed, it argues that natural effects can become objects of knowledge only through social acts of interpretation. For SSK, the "fore-structure" of scientific interpretation is comprised of social institutions (categories, rules, etc.). These institutions are themselves generated and sustained by intersubjective "forms of life," that is, diverse practices of social stabilization existing between community members. This intersubjective account of scientific knowledge is meant to avoid sceptical problems threatening individualistic accounts of normativity and meaning. By introducing a notion of "transsubjective corporeity," modeled on individual corporeity, Ginev risks making his own position vulnerable to those same sceptical problems. An individual by any other name will not this challenge meet. My own money goes on a combination of hermeneutic phenomenology and social constructivism, but this carries risks of its own; more on that some other time.

I conclude by reiterating that Dimitri Ginev is among the most ambitious and interesting philosophers currently applying methods of phenomenology and hermeneutics in a general account of the scientific enterprise. The Tenets of Cognitive Existentialism is a complex and challenging statement of his position, and a must read for those working in similar areas. But the book also merits a far wider audience than that. Greater critical exploration of the diversity of methods available to philosophers of science cannot but help to enrich the field, not to mention our understanding of the exhilarating enterprise that field takes as its object.[1]


Bloor, David (2004). "Sociology of Scientific Knowledge." In I. Niiniluoto, M. Sintonen & J. WoleĊ„ski (eds.), Handbook of Epistemology (Dordecht: Kluwer), pp. 919-962.

Heidegger, Martin (1962[1927]). Being and Time, trans. J. Macquarrie & E. Robinson (Oxford: Blackwell).

[1] Thanks to Dimitri Ginev for kindly arguing with me over a draft of this review.