The Testimony of the Spirit: New Essays

Placeholder book cover

R. Douglas Geivett and Paul Moser, (eds.), The Testimony of the Spirit: New Essays, Oxford University Press, 282pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780190225407.

Reviewed by Adam Green, Azusa Pacific University


The Holy Spirit (HS), the third member of the Christian trinity, is like the wind, and "you cannot tell where it comes from or where it is going" (John 3:8 NIV). Sometimes Christian academics feel obligated to try, though. This volume is composed of an introduction and eleven essays which cover a wide variety of topics from moral epistemology to gendered language for God to apologetics to art.

Setting aside the chapter summaries at its end, the introduction by editors Doug Geivett and Paul Moser functions as a stand-alone essay. What is most striking about the text is its resonance with Moser's work on divine hiddenness and religious epistemology. As with Moser's prior work, Geivett and Moser argue that God provides us with "a distinctive kind of religious experience" (11) by providing us "a nondiscursive manifestational witness in human experience to God's reality" (12). This witness is to God's moral character as self-giving love, agape, but because of the nature of the revelation, it requires a cooperative, moral embrace of agape by the recipient to truly be received. Hence, divine hiddenness and religious experience are bound up with God's desire to have a relationship with us based on a revelation of and call to agape to which we are naturally resistant. This much is familiar territory. What is underlined by the essay is the way in which this perspective that Moser has previously defended is bound up with a particular pneumatology. For Moser, the HS's job is to convict the world of sin and to produce the fruit of self-giving love in our lives. Thus, since the work of the HS is a privileged window into what the divine is up to in our world, one has a rationale for elevating a particular kind of religious experience, a divine being's challenging one to enter its life of self-giving love, over alternative religious experiences and over merely philosophical arguments generally.

The next two chapters, by Craig Evans and Jeremiah Johnston and by Stephen Davis respectively, offer one a framework for thinking about the biblical evidence regarding what the Spirit is and does. Evans and Johnston work through the way in which the Spirit of God shows up in the Old Testament, in the intertestamental period, and in the New Testament. They conclude that across these various literatures the HS shows up as a power associated with the communication of God's mind and will, as well as the empowerment of individuals to make known that mind or do that will. The difference between how the HS shows up from the Old to the New Testaments consists in a narrowing of focus in the content the HS communicates (to content focused on Jesus) and a broadening of the vehicles moved directly by the HS (to all the members of a church composed of every nation). Davis complements this picture by synthesizing the biblical evidence regarding what sort of thing the HS is. He concludes that "it is part of the Spirit's nature" "to be intensely and intimately and lovingly related to humans," "to be a verbalizer," and "to dwell in (certain) human beings" (65). What is left unclear by Davis, however, is what it means for these things to be in the HS's nature as opposed to their being activities the HS is associated with. It seems unlikely, for example, that Davis is claiming that in every possible world in which the HS exists, there are also human beings to be indwelt, loved, and verbalized to.

The essays by Paul Gooch and by C. Stephen Evans concern the relationship of the HS to morality generally and to conscience specifically. Gooch makes a case for the importance of separating how one thinks about the nature and function of the conscience from the work of the HS. The identification can be tempting given the way people relate to the conscience as a moral authority to which one is beholden. Gooch, by contrast, claims that sometimes "conscience will need to be silenced by the more compelling witness of the Spirit" (82). At best, he claims, the HS can on occasion use the conscience as a vehicle. Evans, similarly, claims that the HS can use one's conscience to convey moral truths, but that caution is in order. The epistemic connection to the HS is indirect in the case of conscience (93) and subject to cultural noise (95). Special revelation, on the other hand, is a more apt means of conveying moral truths, especially ones that serve as correctives to culture and conscience (104).

One's access to special revelation and its interpretation, however, is going to be mediated by some set of creaturely faculties as well as traditions of interpretation if one is not to posit that the HS circumvents all human agencies by directly causing the relevant moral beliefs. It isn't really clear from the essay why the cautions that attend the HS's potential work through conscience couldn't be redeployed against putative sources of special revelation or putative direct interventions outside the reach of conscious awareness.

Roger Trigg's essay on the diversity of religious belief intersects these concerns from moral epistemology. On the one hand, there is diversity in claims to religious truth, indeed claims to truths underwritten by the authority of the HS. This ought to moderate our confidence in these claims. On the other hand, he's concerned to avoid relativism. In trying to thread the needle between the two, Trigg affirms an interpretation of the cognitive science of religion according to which human nature lends itself to but does not determine religious belief. Furthermore, he claims that "spiritual testimony cannot be coercive" and "great spiritual experiences" such as those of St Paul or John Wesley are "the culmination of much seeking" (123).

A comparison of the introduction with the essays by Gooch, Evans, and Trigg raises certain questions. How is Moser and Geivett's emphasis on the moral character of the HS's testimony consistent with the resistance of Gooch and Evans to identify the work of the HS too closely with that of conscience? What do we make of Moser and Geivett's assertion that the moral witness of the HS should be our sole grounds for belief in God (12) given the reality of religious diversity and Trigg's scaling back what can be affirmed of the HS as a result? It wouldn't be too hard to come up with a logically possible story that affirmed the thrust of each of these authors, but one wonders whether they aren't pulling one in different directions.

Neuropsychologist Malcolm Jeeves sets out to review the state of neuroscience vis-à-vis religion and spirituality. While work in the 1980s seemed to lend support to the idea that religious experiences are strongly associated with irregular activity in the temporal lobe, subsequent research has shown that the original temporal lobe studies by Michael Persinger do not replicate well and that different religious experiences and practices elicit very different patterns of brain activation. The implication for thinking about the HS, left mostly implicit, appears to be that we should expect the HS to show up within embodied experience but not to be identified with some distinctive pattern of brain activity. That conclusion seems fair enough. There is, however, a worry about the piece and recent work on the topic. The latest reference is 2009, and the bulk of the references are from 2004 to 2006. Given how fast neuroscience can move and the absence of any references to the cognitive science of religion, it is only with some trepidation that we should assume Jeeves provides us with a representative sense of the state of play in the brain sciences.

Oliver Davies also appeals to the state of the brain sciences, relating it to the work of continental thinkers like Paul Ricoeur to provide a "neuroanthropological pneumatology". Davies opens with the observation that "in biblical texts the Spirit is known in its evidencing of the power of God within material form" (151). The association of the HS with immanence invites the question: how might changing the way we think about our material embodiment change the way we think about the HS? Davies invokes the social emphasis of much recent work in neuroscience and connects it to Ricoeur's notion of "belonging to the world". The self is essentially enmeshed in its physically relating to others. Davies seems to think that our most essential physical link to others is through the articulation of language. Davies concludes from this that "it is the reception of the neighbor, which is the first work of our spirit as the Spirit's creature, that is also our first acceptance of the work of the Spirit in us and between us; and so too is the ground of our hope" (171). One wonders how exclusively Davies envisions this emphasis on the HS's working through one's relationship to the neighbor. His strong language seems to imply that the Desert Fathers and Mothers, and most Christian mystics across the centuries, were at least very confused in their attempts to connect to the Spirit through spiritual practices of solitude and contemplation.

Steven Guthrie explores the relationship between the HS and the arts. He begins by highlighting the way in which an old pre-Christian picture of poetic inspiration makes the poet out to be like a medium, a mouthpiece for the gods. In the biblical context, he stresses the move from thinking of poetic inspiration as possession to thinking of it as gift, though still one mediated by divine agency. He draws attention to the way that the language that surrounds the creation of art and its power to move us is deeply resonant with the language of religious inspiration, especially in the Romantics. Though the arts can sometimes be used to try to replace something that is lost when religion is jettisoned (as with many of the Romantics), Guthrie thinks there's more to this overlap in language and experience. "Through the play of the artist, the Spirit bears witness to a cosmos whose deepest logic is not utility, competitive advantage, and survival of the fittest, but freedom, delight, and grace" (193). As Guthrie acknowledges, art can also be used to send a different kind of message, one not as in keeping with the work of the HS. The power of art can be harnessed in a way that gives life or that promotes despair.

Elizabeth Groppe argues that the way we think about God's relationship to gender can similarly be either life-giving or life-denying. The HS is a tempting focus for someone bothered by the masculine overtones of identifying the first and second person of the Trinity as Father and Son. The HS seems more neutral, if not to lend itself towards a feminine conceptualization (e.g. brooding over the world; identifying with the birth pangs of creation). Groppe follows Sarah Coakley in thinking that the most fundamental way of casting off theologically cloaked sexism won't be in re-gendering the members of the Trinity. What would strike more at the root of the problem for Groppe, following Coakley, is a theology and praxis of erotic desire, spiritually conceived and fostered within ascetic spiritual practices. Against the backdrop of cultivating "the freedom to desire the very desire of God" (216), Groppe seems to think we should adopt those practices of naming God least likely to alienate people from desiring God.

Kevin Kinghorn and Jerry Walls tackle the question of how apologetics relates to the HS, a topic that gains some importance given Moser's critique of offering arguments for God's existence on the one hand and the concern one might take away from Groppe about the need to draw people to God instead of coercing them into theological alignment. Kinghorn and Walls offer a picture of apologetics as a multi-pronged affair spanning the cognitive and emotional, the philosophical and the aesthetic. Apologetics must be conducted with an awareness that a successful defense would not simply fend off a threat but convey something of the desirability and availability of a relationship with the divine. Likewise, they stress that the biblical witness is that having the desired effect on another person is the work of the HS. Thus, the apologist must cultivate a sensitivity to what the HS is doing and a willingness to join in that work. Trying to argue someone into the faith would be, in effect, a second-order Pelagianism tone-deaf to the nature of both faith and the human person. Kinghorn and Walls, then, develop a position that has olive branches that can be extended to those worried that apologetics is inherently coercive or that it ignores the relational basis of faith.

Finally, Angus Ritchie argues that the locus of discernment for the HS's work is not the individual but the Church. Ritchie's focus quickly narrows to the question of the canon of Scripture and its status as inspired for Protestants. He argues that there is no basis within the Scriptures alone for the Protestant position on inspiration developed in the Chicago Statement on Biblical Inerrancy of 1978. To be self-consistent, the Protestant has to read even the Chicago Statement as invoking the power of the Church to discern something about the nature of the Scriptures that those same Scriptures do not affirm in so many words.

Though the topics covered are diverse, the reader finds a similar question popping up in almost each chapter. Couldn't one make the same arguments without referencing the HS at all? The Holy Spirit is associated with the immanence of God, an intimate presence "brooding over the deep waters" of both creation and conscience, and yet in many ways why we should have to posit such an entity at all remains elusive. What would one have really lost if early councils of the church had settled on a Binity instead of a Trinity? That a being hovering just above the hungry edge of Ockham's razor should also be intimately involved in our existence and experience is more than a little paradoxical, and in different ways the essays each either wrestle with the issue or cause the reader to do so. Perhaps, however, it should be unsurprising that it is the divine as it shows up in immanent intimacy rather than the divine in its transcendent ultimacy that should be the biggest headscratcher for finite creatures like us. That the infinite should be beyond our cognitive reach is itself easy to grasp. That the infinite could be closer than our breath, less so.