The Theory of the Sublime from Longinus to Kant

Placeholder book cover

Robert Doran, The Theory of the Sublime from Longinus to Kant, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 313pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107101531.

Reviewed by Paul Guyer, Brown University


This book is not as comprehensive as its title might suggest. It offers an interpretation of Peri Hypsous, "On the Sublime," by "pseudo-Longinus," the first- or third-century author whose work, unmentioned by other ancients, was found in a tenth-century manuscript, published in Italy in 1554, and then translated into English and French in the course of the seventeenth century to great effect. It has two chapters on key figures in the transmission of "Longinus" to the eighteenth century, the French translator Nicolas Boileau and the English critic John Dennis, followed by a chapter on Edmund Burke's 1757 Philosophical Enquiry into the Origin of Our Ideas of the Sublime and Beautiful. And there are six chapters on the sublime in Kant, one on Kant's early Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime, one on Kant's use of the concept of sublimity in his moral philosophy, particularly the Critique of Practical Reason, and then four on the sublime in the Critique of the Power of Judgment, the first of these on Kant's general concept, the second on the mathematical sublime, the third on the dynamical sublime, and the last on Kant's use of the sublime in his "cultural criticism" and on the possibility of sublime art as well as nature. Thus the book is really a commentary on Kant on the sublime, prefaced with a treatment of Burke, whom the author considers the most important influence on Kant, and in turn with a treatment of "Longinus," whom the author considers the most important influence on Burke. Apart from the discussion of Dennis, there is no discussion of the vast British literature on the sublime, as documented, for example, in Andrew Ashfield and Peter de Bolla's 1996 anthology The Sublime: A Reader in British Eighteenth-century Aesthetic Theory (Cambridge University Press), nor is there discussion of the extensive German discussion apart from brief reference to Moses Mendelssohn's 1758 review of Burke (which made Burke's work known in Germany well before Christian Garve's 1773 translation).

Robert Doran's theses are that "Longinus" did not consider the sublime solely a literary style, as is often thought (the "rhetorical" interpretation), but also considered it a quality of mind in the artist, specifically the poet, that could be communicated to the audience or reader (an "aesthetic" approach; see for example p. 287); that "Longinus" introduced an "agonistic" (p. 142) analysis of the experience of the sublime, "a dual structure of being overwhelmed or overawed . . . coupled with the idea of being exalted or elevated -- as expressed in the notion of ekstasis (literally: a going outside or beyond oneself, self-transcendence, rapture)" (p. 10), which is then carried over into the views of Burke and Kant; that the experience of self-transcendence takes on a religious dimension in the accounts of the sublime by Dennis, Burke, and Kant; and finally that Boileau makes the experience of the sublime accessible to the homme honnête or honest everyman that marks a transvaluation of values, to borrow a Nietzschean phrase, a valorization of bourgeois over aristocratic culture, which is taken over by Burke but to some degree rejected by Kant. I found this ideological element of Doran's argument its least convincing aspect.

To be sure, Doran's association of the "self-transcendence" aspect of the sublime with religion also initially raised my hackles. Of course, for Dennis and many other writers on the sublime, the experience of the sublime did culminate in an intimation of divinity, of the existence of an intellectual and spiritual power much greater than ourselves that might be taken as a marker of the religious.The experience of the immensity and the power of nature, the starting-points for the varieties of sublime experience that Kant called the mathematical and dynamical, naturally lead to thoughts of the author of nature. As Doran quotes, Dennis aimed "to shew the mutual Dependence that the Greater Poetry has on Religion, and Religion on the Greater Poetry." Further, according to Dennis, "The strongest Enthusiastick Passions, that are justly and reasonably rais'd, must be raised by Religious Ideas" (pp. 128-9). But Joseph Addison, whose essays "On the Pleasures of the Imagination" in The Spectator in June and July, 1712, were at least as influential for eighteenth-century aesthetics as the work of "Longinus." Addison anticipated both the mathematical and the dynamical sublime with descriptions that might be thought to suggest self-transcendence but without any reference to God, in the latter case by writing that "The mind of man naturally hates every thing that looks like a restraint upon it . . . On the contrary, a spacious horizon is an image of liberty" (Spectator 412, June 23, 1712), which refers entirely to our own freedom and pleasure in it, and in the former case by saying that

Nothing is more pleasant to the fancy than to enlarge itself by degrees . . . when it compares the body of a man to the bulk of the whole earth, the earth to the circle it describes around the sun, that circle to the sphere of fixed stars, the sphere of the fixed stars to the circuit of the whole creation

and so on (Spectator 420, July 2, 1712), which refers solely to the pleasure that we take in stretching our own cognitive capacities. It might well be thought that both Burke and Kant actually follow the more secular approach of Addison to the sublime than the religious approach that Doran attributes to "Longinus." Indeed, Burke's first edition purports to explain our pleasure in the sublime solely in terms of the satisfaction of our drive for our own self-preservation in the face of nature and contains no discussion of directly religious experience.

But as Doran correctly points out, in a chapter on the sublimity of "power" added to the second (1759) edition, Burke does include a lengthy passage on the sublimity of our "pure and intellectual" ideas of the Godhead or Deity "through the medium of sensible images . . . such as are capable of affecting the imagination" (p. 166, quoting from Burke's Enquiry, Part II, Section V). So here it seems as if Doran's approach is plausible, although precisely because this passage was added to the second edition one might at least ask how central it is to Burke's conception of the sublime. Indeed one might ask whether it was not added just to placate critics, for the passage is introduced with the remark that "some people are of opinion," which Burke's 1958 editor J.T. Boulton glossed as beginning a response to a review of Burke's first edition. Be this as it may, the characterization of Kant's account of the sublime as religious might still seem troubling -- until Doran writes that for Kant "one gains insight into the sublimity of God through the sublimity of mind occasioned by the virtual resistance to natural might," which refers to our own capacity of resisting natural inclinations and fears for the sake of morality, and that "In this sense, the Dynamically Sublime implies a kind of demystification, an enlightened state of religious understanding. The result is a fully secularized view of nature" (p. 257). Doran continues, "it is not the sublimity of God that produces the awareness of our own sublimity, but the other way around" (pp. 257-8). Thus, the "religious" aspect of Kant's account of the sublime is actually a deconstruction of previous genuinely religious accounts. I can hardly disagree with this, especially since Doran quotes me to the same effect (p. 258). My only complaint here could be that he does not buttress his interpretation by citing Kant's frequent argument in the final convolutes of the Opus postumum that God is not a substance but only an idea, that is, his final, complete reduction of God to an image of our own moral potential. Kant's transformation of self-transcendence in the experience of the (dynamical) sublime to the transcendence of our own sensible nature by our own rational nature and capacity for freedom is but a step on the path to this final transformation of religion altogether. In the end, I have no deep disagreement with Doran's treatment of the religious aspect of the sublime in Burke and Kant.

But I am more dubious about his enlistment of Burke's and Kant's accounts of the sublime in an eighteenth-century subordination of aristocratic to bourgeois values and especially in his final suggestion that Kant actually resists this transvaluation of values to some degree. Doran is a literary scholar rather than a philosopher or historian of philosophy, and an ideological approach to eighteenth-century aesthetics has been common in literary circles since Terry Eagleton's Ideology of the Aesthetic (1990) if not long before. I think such an approach has to be handled with great care. I do not think that the young Burke -- an Irishman without connections in London who was in his early twenties when he wrote the Enquiry hoping to make a quick mark on literary society -- had very well developed political views at all. The case of Kant is more interesting. He wrote the Critique of the Power of Judgment late in his career, when he did have well-developed political views, but they don't seem to play a large role in the third Critique. What's more, when politics does come to the fore, in the one-section "Doctrine of Method" at the end of the "Critique of the Aesthetic Power of Judgment," a passage not discussed by Doran, what Kant writes is that taste, as "at bottom a faculty for the judging of the sensible rendering of moral ideas," might be an

art of the reciprocal communication of the ideas of the most educated part with the cruder, the coordination of the breadth and refinement of the former with the natural simplicity and originality of the latter, . . . that mean between higher culture and contented nature which constitutes the correct standard, not to be given by any universal rule, for taste as a universal human sense (Critique of the Power of Judgment, §60, 5:356).

This does not suggest that any form of aesthetic experience can or should figure in the subordination of one class to another or the replacement of one class by another in the power- and value-structure of a society. It suggests that taste and aesthetic experience can bridge the gap between classes in a society, even though for other reasons such classes are bound to exist.

Finally, Doran finds some resistance to the preference for bourgeois over aristocratic values that had supposedly prevailed in the approach to the sublime from Boileau to Burke in Kant's alleged recognition of the "sublimity of war," purportedly revealed in Kant's remark that not only among "savages" but

even in the most civilized circumstances this exceptionally high esteem for the warrior remains, only now it is demanded that he at the same time display all the virtues of peace, gentleness, compassion . . . precisely because in this way the incoercibility of his mind by danger can be recognized (p. 252, quoting from Critique of the Power of Judgment, §28, 5:262).

This is the kind of passage that has to be handled with care because it is by no means obvious that Kant is endorsing this remaining awe of the warrior in "civilized circumstances". It is certainly part of his philosophy of history that although the human species must believe that it is capable of fully realizing the demands of morality, we are not there yet. Further, this passage must be reconciled with Kant's central argument in the 1795 pamphlet Toward Perpetual Peace, which is precisely that peace will come only through the spread of republican government, where the decision to go to war would have to be made by the populace as a whole rather than by a hereditary monarch (or aristocracy) precisely because the populace would be unwilling to risk their sons and their fortunes for territorial or dynastic gains. This seems to be nothing less than an affirmation of bourgeois over aristocratic values, in a work far more dispositive for Kant's political views than a passing remark in the discussion of the sublime.

This caveat aside, there is much of value in Doran's work. All students of Kant can benefit from his presentation of "Longinus" and of figures often better known to literary scholars rather than philosophers, such as Boileau, Dennis, and even Burke, And all will benefit by working through his detailed interpretation of Kant on the sublime even if they do not agree with it all.