The Thief of Time: Philosophical Essays on Procrastination

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Chrisoula Andreou and Mark D. White (eds), The Thief of Time: Philosophical Essays on Procrastination, Oxford University Press, 2010, 300pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195376685.

Reviewed by Nomy Arpaly, Brown University


Procrastination is a type of irrational behavior -- or so it seems to most -- that has been somewhat neglected in the philosophical literature. While weakness of will has been discussed a lot, and it seems intuitively likely that procrastination is related to weakness of will or akrasia, weakness of will is more often connected in the philosopher's mind with excessive consumption of chocolate than with checking one's email or playing solitaire for the sole purpose of avoiding work. At least so it seems from the literature: in the real life of many academics the procrastination of work presents a genuine and ubiquitous challenge. This is though, as pointed out by Ogden Nash in his poem "Sins of Omission," some kinds of procrastination -- the example of playing solitaire comes to mind -- do not even provide you with the pleasure that chocolate does. No one, the poet reminds us, ever says, "Whee! Let's all fail to write just one more letter before we go home, and this round of unwritten letters is on me."

This book addresses the dearth of philosophical treatments of procrastination. It consists of fifteen articles, some by philosophers and some by psychologists, economists, and others. There are three parts to the book: one concerned with analyzing procrastination and finding out its sources, one that explores the connection between procrastination and imprudence and vice, and one which deals with ways in which procrastination can be overcome. Since the book's subtitle is "Philosophical Essays on Procrastination," a warning might be in order: strictly speaking, some of the essays are not philosophical, and some appear to sit on the borderline between moral psychology and just plain psychology or economics. Some articles even dabble in (scientifically savvy) self-help.

The first part of the book consists mostly of borderline articles. It opens with an article by George Ainslie which I would not call philosophical: it is more of a scientific article readable by philosophers. However, starting with this article may still have been a good idea. If we are to philosophize about procrastination it is best that we are introduced, for example, to the concept of hyperbolic discounting of utilities. Notoriously, we often act as if we prefer smaller short term rewards to larger long term rewards, and when we do so it is said that we hyperbolically discount future goods. Ainslie says that procrastination is the most "basic impulse:" all impulsive behavior involves hyperbolic discounting, but it also involves other things, like addictive substances and other sorts of concrete temptation. Procrastination simply is hyperbolic discounting in action, with no need for another motive (such as excessive pleasure or thrill-seeking) to explain our irrationality.

Hyperbolic discounting will be discussed philosophically through the book along with procrastination as the result of intransitive preferences (at any given occasion, you prefer never smoking to always smoking, but you prefer smoking one last time to never smoking, and so pair-wise choices will lead you to what you prefer the least). Some believe that having such preferences is the source of the irrationality of procrastination, but Duncan MacIntosh (in an article that is clearly within the borders of philosophy) argues that it is not and that procrastination and its irrationality need a different sort of explanation, more akin to philosophical theories of weakness of will. Also present in the first part of the book are an inquiry into the sources of both procrastination and premature action ("bad timing") by Jon Elster, who finds several sources and highlights, among other things, perfectionism as a source of procrastination, as well as an economic-style treatment of procrastination by Don Ross, who seeks to remedy some of the "embarrassment" from which economics has suffered lately due to such books as Predictably Irrational.

Sarah Stroud's essay stands out for the absence of equations and diagrams, and also for its unusual thesis. She asks whether procrastination is weakness of will and comes to the surprising conclusion that it is not. Weakness of will, conceived in Aristotelian terms as acting against one's best judgment or akrasia, is something that happens at a moment whereas procrastination is essentially a thing that happens over time. Weakness of will conceived in newer terms made popular by Richard Holton -- as a failure to stick to a resolution -- requires the formation of an intention or decision, whereas procrastination -- this is where Stroud's paper gets most controversial -- consists partially of either not having formed an intention at all or having formed an intention that is too vague and unspecific. If you "always meant" to go to a doctor "at some point" but never did you have never formed an intention at all, or you only formed a very weak intention, an "anemic" one as Stroud says. This seems to fit some cases of procrastination very well, and fit the empirical literature, mentioned later, that suggests that detailed planning reduces procrastination. I suspect, however, that Stroud's conclusion might conflict with intuitions about cases in which one appears to have made a very specific plan and still procrastinated -- last ditch procrastination, as it were.

The second part of the book is made entirely of philosophical pieces. Olav Gjelsvik discusses procrastination's relation to rationality: he considers various definitions of procrastination and shows that it is quite hard to define -- one too easily includes in one's definition instances in which postponing something is a perfectly reasonable thing to do. He maintains that in procrastination you necessarily do things later in time than you should, and attempts to figure out where that "should" comes from. Through a very complex argument he comes up with a conclusion in favor of external reasons. Christine Tappolet, in an article about procrastination and personal identity, provocatively challenges the idea, dear to some theorists of personal identity, that we have a special concern for our future selves. She basically asks a question that a Martian might ask about us: if we have that much special concern for our future selves, how is it that we treat them so badly? The very fact that a person repeatedly procrastinates quitting cigarettes despite her conviction that they are dangerous to her future self is a reason to believe that she does not have a special concern for that future self. Had we repeatedly treated someone else that badly we would not have been able to say that we particularly care about them. I suspect Tappolet assumes too much rationality on our part: irrational as we are, we are perfectly capable of being greatly attached to our future selves and being reckless with them. But exactly how this is possible -- the question that Tappolet's paper brings into focus -- is as hard a question about human nature as they come.

Three authors discuss procrastination in the context of virtue and vice, none suggesting that it is particularly a moral vice (though even so, I remain a bit bothered by Elijah Millgram following Bernard Williams in suggesting that addiction makes you less than virtuous). Jennifer Baker tells us that there is a lot of discussion over the internet as to whether procrastination is a sin. She thinks the question is more difficult than it seems and presents different virtue-ethics inspired views that underscore this complexity. Research, she says, will not by itself answer the question. Sergio Tenenbaum offers an analysis of a vice of procrastination as a failure in implementing extended plans. Very roughly, if I have a plan to write a book, my extended plan of action has to include both times allocated to actual writing and time allocated to such things as having lunch or playing with my cat, and there has to be some flexibility in how the plan is applied. There is an art -- or rather a virtue -- in holding to the Aristotelian mean between, on the one hand, the inflexible person who misses a friend's wedding because he "has to work" and, on the other, the all-too-flexible procrastinator.

Millgram's paper goes beyond the topic of procrastination to the subject of the good life. He introduces us to the idea of "Jam-Yesterday-Jam-Tomorrow" goods. The term alludes to the job the White Queen offers Alice, which carries the perk of jam yesterday and jam tomorrow but never jam today. The goods in questions are goods that happen over time but appear better somehow then the sum of the moments of which they are composed. For example, a happy marriage can be a wonderful thing but it is mostly made up of prosaic moments that are not particularly happy in themselves. The married couple, in every given moment, is likely to be found grocery shopping or cleaning the bathroom or trying to get children out of bed and only see their happiness in their "peripheral vision." Similarly, a philosopher who loves his job is likely to be found grading or writing letters of recommendation or waiting at an airport or hunting desperately for an idea -- not things he particularly likes. The fact that some of the most important human activities have this structure, where tangible good is always in the past or the future, promotes laziness in the pursuit of those activities, for one can have trouble avoiding procrastination of work whose value is in being part of such activities. Of course, a fully virtuous person would not be lazy. Millgram has complicated conclusions to draw here about "fallback virtue" -- virtue, as it were, for the rest of us -- and about instrumental rationality.

The third part of the book is devoted to ways to overcome procrastination. There is no cure yet, but some treatments are proven to be of help to some. It is tempting to relate some of the advice given in this part of the book, advice backed up by empirical research, and I'll mention just a few tips: you must have specific plans as to when, where, and how you will perform a specific task. It is best if you form what is called an "implementation intention" -- a plan that has an if-then structure, such as "if I turn on the computer, I'll first work on my essay for 20 minutes." You must use "scaffolding" for your will, that is, manipulate the environment in such a way as to make your desired behavior more likely: if you want to be hard-working, for example, try to be around hard-working people. If you tend to check your email too much, make it hard for yourself to connect to the internet (advice is given about specific scaffolding techniques). If you have more self-control in some domains than others, says Chrisoula Andreou, you can "leverage" control -- reward or punish yourself into changing your behavior. There is more (I am talking here about papers by Joseph Heath and Joel Anderson, Frank Wieber and Peter Gollwitzer, as well as Andreou). I fully intend to try some of the methods suggested (when I get around to them). It can become hard to find the philosophy in these science-oriented articles, though again I sympathize with the authors' and editors' desire to make philosophical discussion of the topic more empirically informed. In a different vein, Manuel Ustet, and to some extent Heath and Anderson, asks questions about the legitimacy of allowing public policy and law to aim at reducing procrastination.

One advice-laced article -- by Mark White -- appears to be both more philosophical than others and completely at odds with their conclusions. White posits a view of the mind according to which we have a special faculty of willing but does not -- understandably, given available space -- defend it. He tells us that it is bad to use self-manipulation through one's environment because that might weaken our will through lack of use. Is it because we need our will to fall back on when scaffolding is not available, or is it somehow unseemly or less than moral not to develop our wills -- an abdication of our autonomy ? Definitely the former, but sometimes the latter also appears to be implied. What, then, should we do? White's initial advice is that the agent should "try harder." Later, however, he appeals to current studies showing that the will, like a muscle, can be strengthened by training, and advises us to train our wills. It is unclear that autonomous Kantian wills are the sort of things that can weaken from lack of use or grow in the manner of muscles, for are they not things that all rational agents have to the same degree no matter what? White also appears to overlook the fact that training the will like a muscle is a somewhat different thing to do from "trying harder." One does not develop the ability to lift a large rock simply by trying harder to do it but through a process that involves such things as starting with smaller rocks, alternating between exertion and rest, getting enough food of the right sort, and so on. In other words, training the will as if it were a muscle would involve some self-manipulation through the environment.

All in all, this collection is good reading for anyone who would like to do philosophy on the subject of procrastination or who seeks to procrastinate her work by reading interesting things.