The Time of Our Lives: A Critical History of Temporality

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David Couzens Hoy, The Time of Our Lives: A Critical History of Temporality, MIT Press, 2009, 288pp., $34.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262013048.

Reviewed by Levi R. Bryant, Collin College


If one were to cite one set of issues that distinguishes the Continental philosophy of the last century from prior philosophy, a red thread uniting movements as disparate as Frankfurt school critical theory, German and French phenomenology, and French post-structuralism, it would be no exaggeration to cite the focus of these philosophical movements on issues revolving around time and temporality. To be sure, Aristotle had reflected on the nature of time in his Physics, just as Augustine presented a profound meditation on the nature of time in his Confessions. Moreover, attempts to conceptualize the nature of time have never been absent in the history of philosophy. However, never before had questions of time been given the centrality, the pride of place, they took on in the Continental philosophy of the last century. Here questions of time were no longer treated as an ancillary issue, belonging perhaps to philosophical physics. To the contrary, what was new in the Continental thought of the last century was a sense that questions of time and temporality lay at the heart of questions of ontology, epistemology, philosophy of mind, ethics, and political theory.

The twentieth-century philosophical literature surrounding questions of time and temporality is vast, eclectic, complicated, and difficult. It is hard to see, for example, what might unite the historical meditations of quasi critical theorists such as Walter Benjamin with the phenomenological investigations of temporality carried out by Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty. It is for this reason that David Couzens Hoy's The Time of Our Lives is such a welcome contribution to the philosophical literature surrounding questions of temporality. Written in a lively and exceptionally clear style, Hoy's book is wide ranging, lucidly discussing the theories of time and temporality developed by Kant, Nietzsche, Bergson, James, Husserl, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Bourdieu, Derrida, Deleuze, Benjamin, and Žižek. Hoy successfully manages to put these thinkers, so diverse in their methodologies and preoccupations, in dialogue with one another, staging a theater of ideas revolving around the role that temporality plays in our self-relation, the sense of our lives, and questions of politics and ethics.

However, it would be a mistake to imagine that his book is simply a catalogue of theories of temporality, presenting the reader with a convenient series of commentaries on what this or that thinker has said about temporality. Hoy's book, the first volume of a history of consciousness, is an excellent resource for the student or scholar seeking some orientation within the bewildering labyrinth of Continental thought surrounding questions of temporality. This first volume deals with time and time-consciousness; the second will deal with self-consciousness. Hoy's provocative thesis, contra Kant and Husserl, is that temporality precedes the self-relation of self-consciousness, and is therefore prior to the self and mind.

At the outset, Hoy is careful to distinguish time and temporality. While time, according to Hoy, pertains to the universal time of, perhaps, physics, temporality refers to time as it pertains to human existence:

The term "time" can be used to refer to universal time, clock time, or objective time. In contrast, "temporality" is time insofar as it manifests itself in human existence. Note that I have cautiously not specified temporality as "subjective time," or "experienced time," because these terms are at issue. Instead, my intention is to discuss philosophical accounts of what has been called "lived time," or "human temporality" -- hence, the "time of our lives." Because our philosophers often do not make this distinction between the time of the universe and the time of our lives, it will be hard to maintain in every instance. We may have to ask on occasion, what "time" is it? (xiii)

I have quoted this passage at length as I will return to it later in this review, arguing that Hoy does not push the implications of his own analysis as far as he could. For the moment what is important is that temporality refers to the time of human existence.

At the risk of "spatializing" temporality, Hoy approaches temporality through what might be called a "topology of time". If topology differs from classical geometries, this is because it approaches figures not in terms of their metric properties or as fixed structures, but as entities capable of undergoing continuous deformation while maintaining their structure. Thus, for example, scalene, equilateral, isosceles, and right triangles are topologically equivalent to one another in that they can be transformed into one another through ordered deformations. What is important here is the preservation of structure, of certain relationships among singularities, not the metric properties of any particular structure. Similarly, under Hoy's analysis, temporality differs from the universal time of physics in that it forms a topological structure, a structure of interrelationships, in which past, present, and future cannot be thought apart from one another. Thus, for example, the "present" of the present is never a pure present, but rather presents itself in and through a relationship to the past and future. What shows up as "present" in human existence under Heidegger's reading, for example, is a function of the manner in which we project possibilities before ourselves and draw upon the past to render present the present of our engagement. The world "shows up" or is "illuminated" as a function of the way in which we project these possibilities before ourselves.

Hoy devotes a chapter to each of the temporal dimensions of the past, the present, and the future, examining how various Continental thinkers have theorized these dimensions of temporality. Each of these chapters concludes with a set of reflections, taking stock of the findings, showing how positions that appear to be inconsistent with one another are in fact complementary or draw attention to different aspects of the same phenomenon, and underlining the issues and questions raised by these conceptualizations of temporality.

The chapter on the present covers the theories of the present developed by Hegel, James, Husserl, Heidegger, Mereleau-Ponty, Nietzsche, Derrida, and Deleuze. What emerges through the various theorizations of the present is a critique of the present as a "pure now" without reference to the past or the future, memory or retention. Hoy shows how the present presents itself only in relation to the past and future.

The chapter on the past focuses on Husserl's account of retention, Bergson's account of memory, Bourdieu's account of habitus, and Deleuze's analysis of the pure past. Here a debate is staged between Husserl's conception of the present as fading into the past through retention and Bergson's and Proust's account of the manner in which the past persists in the present as a dimension of the present. Hoy shows how, far from standing in contradiction to one another, these conceptions of our relation to the past are, in fact, complementary accounts of how we relate to the past.

Finally, the chapter on the future grapples with the teological and eschatological account of the future presented by Kant and Hegel, Heidegger's account of the futural, Benjamin's account of the angel of history, Deleuze's appropriation of Nietzsche's eternal return, Derrida's messianism without a messiah, and Žižek's reading of Melville's Bartleby. This is among the most political and ethical chapters of Hoy's book, focusing on the heated question of how political engagement is possible in the absence of hope or once we have surrendered teleological and eschatological accounts of history.

The final two chapters of Hoy's book are among the finest to be found in a book already filled with riches, and develop a critique of phenomenology, critical theory, and hermeneutics, instead defending what Hoy refers to -- following Nietzsche, Derrida, Deleuze, and Foucault -- as "genealogy". In suggesting that Hoy carries out a critique of phenomenology, critical theory, and hermeneutics, it is important to exercise caution. A critique is not a rejection but is, as it were, a sort of sublation. The discoveries of phenomenology, critical theory, and hermeneutics are retained, but in a new form where the shortcomings of these approaches are disclosed and a more sophisticated position is articulated.

If phenomenology falls under this critique, it is because its descriptivism presents itself as an impartial and ahistorical analysis of lived experience that fails to take into account the manner in which our experience is historically in-formed. Hoy criticizes critical theory somewhat unfairly: in analyzing ideology and false consciousness, he suggests, it fails to evaluate critically its own position of enunciation and the notion of "true interests" that it uses as a foil for analyzing false consciousness. Finally, hermeneutics is critiqued for its lack of attentiveness to the futural and the present in its careful analysis of historically informed consciousness. If genealogy is to be preferred to these theoretical stances, this is because genealogy recognizes that it is not a view from nowhere, but that its analysis always proceeds premised on a particular set of interests and concerns and because genealogy recognizes the contingency of its own values and concerns and seeks not simply to analyze the world but to contribute to changing the world.

As I noted at the beginning of this review, Hoy draws a distinction between time and temporality. Whereas time, according to Hoy, refers to the universal time or objective time of physics and the natural world, temporality refers to the time of human existence. However, as Hoy's analysis of temporality proceeds, this distinction is itself called into question. In the final chapter, Hoy seems to side with the thesis of later Heidegger, holding that temporality does not issue from the subject or mind, but rather that the self or mind issues from temporality:

The contrast between the early and later Heidegger is brought out nicely in the later Heidegger's discussion of the sentence from Being and Time, "Es gibt Sein" (literally, "it gives Being," although it is better translated as "There is being"). The early Heidegger was often read as meaning by the "Es" that the giver of Being was Dasein. In 1947, however, the later Heidegger maintains in the "Letter on Humanism" that when Being and Time says "Es gibt Sein," the "Es" is Sein. In the early text, the sentence in question reads, "Only so long as Dasein is, is there [gibt es] Being." The later Heidegger claims that because Being is both the clearing and what sends the clearing, Dasein was not meant to be the clearing. (201)

Later Hoy remarks that "it is not the subject that temporalizes, but temporality itself that temporalizes" (217). In short, temporality is not to be conceived (as in the case of Kant or Husserl) as a product of the subject, but rather temporality is a more "primordial root" out of which the subject itself emerges.

It is here, in relation to the thesis of temporality as the primordial root of being, that questions about Hoy's project emerge. If (following the later Heidegger) temporality, not the subject, is the primordial root of being, why draw a distinction between the universal time of physics and the temporality of human existence? If, indeed, the "Es" of the "Es gibt Sein" is temporality rather than Dasein, then it would seem that the distinction between universal time and human temporality collapses and that there is no special reason to privilege human existence where inquiries into being are concerned. Both universal time and human temporality would be dimensions of this primordial root. One potential problem with Hoy's analysis of temporality is that while it is at pains to distinguish itself from the anti-realist thesis that the being of beings is unthinkable apart from a relation to the subject or mind in taking care not to equate temporality with mind or consciousness, in treating temporality as pertaining to human existence it nonetheless remains within the anti-realist orbit. Yet strangely, over the course of his investigation, Hoy develops a number of resources for delivering a realist account of temporality.

A realist account of temporality would not consist in taking the physicist at his word so that we would be called to reduce temporality to what Hoy calls "universal time". Instead, a realist account of temporality would call for a more profound metaphysics, a temporal metaphysics, that responds to the critiques of ontotheology advanced by Derrida and Heidegger, but which is nonetheless a metaphysics in the sense that it shows how the being of beings issues from temporality. Here the human would be given no special privilege; it would not be seen as the medium of the being of beings, but rather the being of beings would be seen as issuing from temporality or difference. This would include the human as among beings, while refusing the Ptolemaic gesture of placing humans at the center of being or giving the human a privileged place within being. While Hoy has seen that it is not the subject but rather being that temporalizes, his analysis nonetheless restricts itself to the human.

Despite this reservation, Hoy's book is an illuminating analysis of theories of temporality within the Continental tradition of the last century and is destined to have an important impact on subsequent thought and research. Hoy's failure to go all the way with his own findings is to be excused on the grounds that the focus of his book is the history of consciousness. The thesis that temporality precedes the subject, not the subject temporality, is a welcome contribution to debates surrounding temporality and the subject. Moreover, his analysis of the manner in which questions of temporality are at the heart of political and ethical issues is a welcome contribution deserving of further elaboration. The Time of Our Lives provides a wonderful orientation to the student trying to navigate the bewildering and difficult philosophical literature on temporality belonging to the last century, and provides much food for thought.