The Treatise on the Divine Nature, Summa Theologiae I, 1-13

Placeholder book cover

Thomas Aquinas, The Treatise on the Divine Nature, Summa Theologiae I, 1-13, translated with commentary by Brian Shanley O.P., Hackett, 2006, 370pp, $16.95, ISBN 0872208060.

Reviewed by Brian Davies, Fordham University


The first thirteen questions of the first part of Aquinas's Summa Theologiae (ST) provide a substantial amount of Aquinas's philosophy of God. Following a section on what Aquinas calls sacra doctrina, these questions go on to ask whether it can be shown that God exists, whether he is simple, perfect, good, infinite, immutable, eternal, and one. They then consider how God is known by human beings in this life and the next, and how we should think of the language people use when talking about God and creatures. Aquinas reserves other topics concerning God's nature to later questions in the Summa Theologiae (ST I, 14-26), but the foundations for his answers to these questions are all pretty much laid down in Ia, 1-13.

Not surprisingly, therefore, this part of the Summa Theologiae has been one of the most studied and discussed segments in the whole of Aquinas's writings (along with parallel texts in his Summa Contra Gentiles and his De Potentia). Insofar as Aquinas is studied at the undergraduate level, it is this (or part of this) material that professors (regardless of where they teach) tend to assign for student reading. Though ST I, 1-13 has been much written on, however, there is not too much on it that can be confidently given to those approaching it for the first time. There are some notable introductions to Aquinas currently available, but these inevitably have to pass over ST I, 1-13 fairly quickly. There is a mountain of scholarly literature on ST I, 1-13, but most of this presupposes a lot of knowledge of Aquinas in its readers, or is too dense and technical for beginners.

The present volume is, therefore, most welcome. For, as well as providing a new translation of all of ST I, 1-13, it offers a substantial commentary on this text, one which presupposes no previous familiarity with Aquinas as a thinker. There is, I believe, no other book (none easily available, anyway) that does just this. There are translations of Aquinas which include ST I, 1-13; but these come with little help for someone new to Aquinas and to this text in particular, someone needing to be 'talked through' the material in detail. There are paraphrases or 'companions' to the Summa Theologiae, ones which have things to offer on ST I, 1-13; but these do not provide a careful translation of all of that text, and they tend to pass over many of its details in silence and with no explanatory matter. So Fr Shanley's volume fills a definite gap. It should prove very helpful to anyone teaching ST I, 1-13 at both the undergraduate and graduate level. I would also expect it to be especially useful to people studying ST I, 1-13 entirely on their own.

Having completed his translation and commentary for this volume, Fr Shanley was unable to revise the manuscript or to write an introduction. That task was undertaken by Robert Pasnau (who provides the book's Introduction) and Jeffrey Hause, who nicely observe that 'any faults that remain should in all fairness be ascribed not to the author, but to his editors' (p.x). Pasnau's introduction runs to twenty pages. The translation of Aquinas comes to 151 pages. Fr Shanley's commentary (including a bibliography which he provides) amounts to 212 pages.

On the whole, Pasnau's Introduction (aimed very much at neophytes) is helpfully informative. It locates Aquinas historically, and it explains the nature and structure of the Summa Theologiae. Having briefly run through the contents of ST I, 1-13, Pasnau then makes it clear how to read an article in the Summa Theologiae (considered as a dramatically abbreviated Disputed Question). This is all just what is needed for a volume like Fr Shanley's. Pasnau, though, is, perhaps, exaggerating to say (p.xi) that Aquinas taught for 'many years' at the University of Paris (he taught there only for roughly eleven years). It is also arguably misleading of Pasnau to suggest that every question in the Summa Theologiae following ST I, 1-13 'presupposes that there is a God, and that this God has a certain nature [so that] there is almost nothing in the Summa Theologiae that does not somehow rest on the conclusions established in these initial thirteen questions' (p.xiii). This suggestion is misleading since not one of the Summa Theologiae's initial thirteen questions fails to presuppose that there is a God whose nature is to be thought of in certain ways. ST I, 1-13 is not a discussion of God's existence that is open to the suggestion that there might be no God after all.

Fortunately, however, readers of Fr Shanley's commentary will come to understand all this. For this commentary is lucid, well informed, clearly written, and, given its word count, very comprehensive. Fr Shanley homes in on just what one would look for in a volume like the present. Hence we find him explaining Aquinas's technical terms and showing how bits of ST I, 1-13 connect with each other. He also relates Aquinas to previous and contemporary thinkers with whom Aquinas is engaging. The end product is something that can be warmly recommended to anyone looking for what Fr Shanley has tried to provide. And I should add that Fr Shanley's translation of ST I, 1-13 is just fine. It is clear, idiomatic, and (so far as I can tell from a number of spot checks) accurate. A particular virtue of the translation is that it frequently indicates along the way which Latin terms are being rendered into English as Fr Shanley renders them. This kind of flagging will help readers to get a better sense of what Aquinas is saying than they might otherwise do.

As I have said, Fr Shanley's commentary is very good. To conclude this review on a more critical note, however, I think that one might reasonably take issue with some of what we find in its discussion of ST I, 2 (on whether God exists and how we can know that he does). This text is probably the most studied thing that Aquinas ever wrote, and Fr Shanley's remarks on it shall probably be the most studied ones in his text. Unfortunately, they sometimes strike me as open to question since they seem to me to convey the impression that Aquinas is more open to criticism than he is (for most of the time Fr Shanley has little critical comment to make on Aquinas).

In his commentary on the first of the five ways, for instance, Fr Shanley states that the premise 'Whatever is moved is moved by another' is 'considered by some to be the weak link in the argument and it has been criticized on a number of grounds: it conflicts with Newton's law of inertia, it does not explain projectile motion, and it does not account for living beings' self-motion' (p.193 f). Yet these criticisms arguably do not show that Aquinas's premise is erroneous. Newton never ruled out the need to look for causes for genuine alteration. Causeless projectile motion seems a rum notion. And Aquinas never denies that living things are somehow self-moved; what he denies is that they are entirely self-moved.

Then again, Fr Shanley, I think, gives in too easily when it comes to Aquinas's third way. For he seems to suggest, as many clearly do suggest, that in this Aquinas is wrong to argue that if everything is perishable, then everything would have ceased to exist before now. But is Aquinas arguing this in the course of his third way? Maybe not. For his text here (especially when read alongside a very similar one in Summa Contra Gentiles I, 15) allows us to take him only to be (plausibly) arguing that if everything is contingent, then there would be nothing (since contingent things all owe their existence to something other than themselves).

Yet again, Fr Shanley ends his commentary on Aquinas's fourth way by saying: 'This argument is considered by most commentators to be the weakest of the five. It is considered persuasive only to someone willing to grant some broadly Neoplatonic assumptions about the need to postulate some perfect, unitary, existing source for multiple and limited instances of a positive property' (p.197). One does not have to be a Neoplatonist, however, to make sense of what Aquinas is arguing in his fourth way. This is a causal argument (like all of Aquinas's arguments for the truth of 'God exists'), and it maintains that perfections as we find them in things have to be caused by something they reflect. This is reasoning that Aquinas employs in ST I, 13, where Fr Shanley finds no dubious Neoplatonic presuppositions. (I am not here claiming that the fourth way works; but I think it good for students of it not to be left with the thought that you have to be a Neoplatonist in order to swallow it.)

A final point. At the end of his book Fr Shanley lists English translations of Aquinas's texts. Astonishingly, though, he omits to draw attention to the 59 volume edition of the Summa Theologiae published under the auspices of the English Dominican friars by Eyre and Spottiswoode (London) and the McGraw-Hill Book Company (New York) between 1964 and 1981. Anyone working on the Summa Theologiae should be aware of this monumental contribution to Aquinas scholarship.