The Two Faces of Justice

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Jiwei Ci, The Two Faces of Justice, Harvard University Press, 2006, 252pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0674021606.

Reviewed by Erin M. Cline, University of Oregon


In this work, Jiwei Ci argues that the disposition toward justice is defined by a tension between its conditional nature and its unconditional requirements, and that this tension holds the key to understanding the moral psychology of justice. In contrast with much of the contemporary literature on justice, which focuses on the form and content of substantive conceptions of justice, this book seeks to explain "the failure of significant numbers of people to comply with what are generally regarded as more or less acceptable norms, or worse, the failure of the state to enforce such norms seriously and effectively, and as a result, the gradual unraveling of the whole social fabric of justice" (p. 2). The book accounts for this failure by arguing that justice has two faces: "the conditionality of interest," seen in the willingness of people to act justly provided that other members of the relevant group act justly, and "the unconditionality of morality," seen in institutions which exist "to remove conditionality from the human willingness to be just, and thereby counteract the otherwise contagious nature of breaches of justice" (p. 5). By drawing on the accounts of Hume, Nietzsche, and Schopenhauer, this work offers an explanatory theory of how the conditional and unconditional faces of justice combine to make justice "a commendable yet 'jealous' individual virtue, an impressive yet precarious social institution" (p. 9).

The book begins with a general discussion of the disposition toward justice, followed by an account of the circumstances to which justice is a response. Chapter Two seeks to defend a modified Humean account of the subjective circumstances of justice, defined as "the motives and dispositions that make justice both necessary and possible," which amount to egoism or a lack of altruism, complemented by the idea of competing conceptions of the good. Chapter Three evaluates four competing accounts of the objective circumstances of justice, understood as "certain vital needs common to all human beings" as well as the external features of the human condition that make the satisfaction of those needs difficult or impossible without the institution of justice. Chapters four through six attempt to rule out certain accounts of the disposition toward justice, including Schopenhauer's "voluntary justice," rational egoism, and a conception of justice as impartiality. The main argument of the book appears in chapters seven through nine, which offer a broad exploration of the nature of the reciprocal or conditional relationship between agents, possible ways of making the practice of justice unconditional in the face of the motivational conditionality of justice, and the role of forgetting, resentment, and punishment in "the transfiguration of justice" from a conditional motive to an apparently unconditional one. The last three chapters discuss forgiveness and sympathy in relation to the disposition toward justice and offer an analysis of justice as a mode of moral consciousness.

Ci notes in the introduction that this work departs from the norms of moral and political philosophy in the analytic tradition by not offering one continuous line of argument, instead presenting a range of ideas and arguments "of varying degrees of generality, intended to illuminate diverse yet connected aspects of the disposition to be just and the two faces of justice reflected therein" (p. 10). He also operates with a "somewhat different understanding of philosophical rigor from that which generally informs the analytic tradition," in that he understands rigor to mean "a relentless yet sensitive probing that goes after the deepest insights rather than the tightest analysis," an approach he says is modeled after the work of Nietzsche. Although Ci sometimes offers clear arguments when he criticizes aspects of other theories, developed arguments are not always in evidence when he presents his preferred view. There is, though, a thematic thread that runs through the book, seen in the idea that "a just person's willingness to be just is conditional on other people's showing the same willingness" (p. 21). On this view, a principle aim of justice is the reciprocal satisfaction of interests, and its defining feature is "the motive of exchange" or the expectation that other members of one's community do likewise, which distinguishes it from other virtues and properties of social institutions. It also makes the disposition toward justice conditional and thus in need of "unconditional imperatives."

A number of unexamined assumptions about human nature heavily inform this account of justice. Justice is seen as a virtue that must be acquired, as opposed to the development of something we already have initial tendencies toward. The book focuses on how we are to overcome our egoistic tendencies; indeed, the last chapter notes that

a sense of justice implies the simultaneous existence of inclinations contrary to justice and the ability regularly to overcome them … such coexistence is the product of socialization, which takes the impulses contrary to justice as given … and sets about correcting them by inculcating a sense of justice.

Ci adds, "Justice is, in the first instance, that in the name of which society compels individuals to overcome themselves" (p. 241). Here we can see clearly the extent to which Ci's account provides a marked contrast to someone like Rawls, for whom a sense of justice is a basic moral capacity to be extended and developed, as opposed to inculcated.

Indeed, throughout the work, Ci notes how his account differs from other alternatives, and he draws selectively on the history of Western philosophy, including contemporary voices such as Brian Barry, Allen Buchanan, Thomas Nagel, Judith Shklar, Bernard Williams and of course Rawls, as well as his staples of Hume, Nietzsche, and Schopenhauer. There are, though, some lingering questions about his use of these sources. The book's analysis of Nietzsche and Schopenhauer is based almost entirely on primary sources, and at times, the secondary literature is neglected to the detriment of the account. For example, in his discussion of justice and resentment, Ci briefly addresses the idea of ressentiment in the work of Nietzsche, but only with respect to what ressentiment has in common with resentment, leaving aside a number of important issues concerning the distinction between these ideas raised by contemporary interpreters of Nietzsche (p. 184). An issue concerning the work of Kierkegaard arises in chapter eight, where the book offers an account of a disposition towards justice that is sustained by a theistic outlook, but the account of Kierkegaard is based on pseudonymous works and neglects the non-pseudonymous works that contain the clearest formulation of Kierkegaard's view (p. 168-172). Now the positive side of the fact that Ci deals almost exclusively with primary sources is that he avoids stock readings, and there are a number of places where he offers interesting new interpretations and applications of ideas to issues that have not been considered before. In some places, though, this sort of innovativeness generates additional questions, such as why Nietzsche's account is relied upon so heavily in constructing the moral psychology of justice in light of Nietzsche's own view that justice is a product of slave morality.

Ci should be commended for bringing questions in moral psychology to bear on political philosophy, but while the book engages a great deal of the contemporary work in political theory, much of the relevant literature in ethics is not cited or discussed. One such omission is Phillipa Foot's classic work on the hypothetical nature of morality and on virtues as corrective, which bears directly on the main thesis of the book.[1] John Cooper's work on civic friendship, which would have greatly aided the account of Aristotelian friendship in Chapter Eleven, is neglected as well.[2] It is also surprising that Ci does not address Elliott Sober and David Sloan Wilson's work on altruism, because their views would seem to seriously undermine Ci's accounts of altruism and reciprocity, as well as the general view of human nature that he assumes.[3]

In addition to these specific works, two major bodies of literature in contemporary ethics go unnoticed in the book, the first of which is the work of feminist care ethicists, who have argued that a natural sense of sympathy and care provides the foundation for the cultivation of virtues like justice. It would be particularly interesting to see some engagement with this literature, because certain aspects of Ci's view, such as the claim that sympathy and compassion must be "moralized" through the introduction of rational principles in order to yield the virtues of justice and benevolence, are precisely those which care ethicists have sought to critique. The second body of literature that is neglected is that of virtue ethicists. I have already mentioned Phillipa Foot's work, but there are a number of other serious difficulties that some consideration of virtue ethical accounts might have helped to address, especially concerning the central claim that conditionality is a definitional feature of justice. Ci does not provide an account of what he means by a disposition or a virtue, but if one understands virtues as stable dispositions to act and feel in contextually appropriate ways, then it seems that a general feature of any virtue is at least some degree of unconditionality. Good virtue ethical accounts offer a position between the "motive of exchange" model that Ci describes and categorical obedience. On this view, if someone truly exemplifies the virtue of justice, then their disposition to act and feel in certain ways is much closer to unconditionality, because a virtuous person is willing to sacrifice in a way that an egoistic maximizer is not. Many virtue ethicists would object to the view that justice is defined by the willingness to act justly provided that others act likewise, because the conditionality of interest is one of the things that indicates that justice is not yet a stable disposition in an agent.

Ci's work is a distinctively theoretical philosophical endeavor, and although one of its key aims is to understand what motivates agents who seek to behave justly, it does not offer an analysis of actual agents who embody the virtue of justice. Ci does not consider the psychological or sociological literature on this subject, writing that he is strictly concerned to provide a philosophical account of justice, and not to examine "the empirical circumstances (such as the family or the educational environment) in which a just disposition is formed" (p. 7). He maintains that the moral psychology of Hume, Schopenhauer, and Nietzsche, together with the "insights of a more or less psychological nature" found in contemporary moral philosophy, are more relevant to his particular inquiry than the large body of work by psychologists on moral motivation (p. 9). Ci also notes that his explanatory account is not of the socioeconomic or cultural kind, and that he assumes there is such a thing as a generic disposition toward justice that can be "satisfactorily explained without reference to socioeconomic and cultural factors" (p. 4).

This approach is subject to a number of possible criticisms. First, as we have seen, the book neglects much of the relevant literature in contemporary moral philosophy. Additionally, in order to probe the moral psychology of justice, it would seem advisable to consult at least some of the empirical literature. Empirical and philosophical studies are not necessarily distinct endeavors; this is clearly the case in the current literature on sympathy and empathy. In addition, an account that assumes that "the logic of the socialization of justice" is the same across different cultures and socioeconomic backgrounds should at least provide some historical evidence or examples, and perhaps discuss some philosophical sources outside of America and Europe to help establish this claim. At the very least, a good deal more needs to be said about why the accounts of Hume, Schopenhauer, and Nietzsche are more relevant to this particular endeavor than empirical accounts that many would regard as more reliable and compelling.

A remaining concern is that the book does not present and explore imagined examples or thought experiments in the course of its explanation of what motivates agents to act justly. This is problematic first because an absence of examples or illustrations generates a lack of clarity for the reader. However, the more serious problem with the omission of examples is that in a number of places, counter-examples naturally come to mind. One of the most prominent of these goes to the heart of the main thesis. When we think about individuals who exemplify the virtue of justice, one of the things that often stands out about them is that they act justly even when members of their community or society regularly fail to. The question then is whether the failure of individuals to act justly when others do not actually shows that justice is by definition a conditional virtue, or whether it simply shows that these individuals lack the virtue of justice. As we have seen, this is one of the questions a virtue ethical approach might raise. Ci maintains that those who still do what justice requires even when others do not are actually benevolent rather than just, because "the just person insists on reciprocity for the sake of mutual benefit; the benevolent person (more an ideal than a reality) is willing not to demand reciprocity of others" (p. 21). But one might simply reject this definition of justice, as well as the claim that justice and benevolence are not related in a fundamental way. The remark that individuals who do what is just regardless of whether others reciprocate are "more an ideal than a reality" reflects the view of human nature that is assumed throughout the book. However, there are many examples of such individuals throughout the course of history, and these are precisely the individuals we usually identify as exemplifying the virtue of justice. This is one of many places where an examination of examples of just individuals might prove helpful.

However, it may be that some of these criticisms and concerns are misplaced given the stated aims of this work. It is important to remember that from the outset Ci intends to "allow room for ideas that complicate and enrich the main themes of the book that nevertheless do not fall neatly into a straight line of argumentation either within a chapter or for the book as a whole" (p. 10). The arguments are intended "not so much to convince by proof as to push a familiar idea further here or provide a new perspective there." This work is meant to be read as "an invitation to share an insight or, where the reader disagrees, an incitement to come up with a different insight" (p. 10). Ci certainly succeeds in extending this invitation, and readers will come away from the book having been prompted to think through a range of important issues surrounding the nature and circumstances of justice.

[1] Phillipa Foot, "Morality as a System of Hypothetical Imperatives," Philosophical Review 81(3): 305-316.

[2] John Cooper, "Political Animals and Civic Friendship," in Friendship: A Philosophical Reader, ed. Neera Kapur Badhwar (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1993), 303-326.

[3] Elliott Sober and David Sloan Wilson, Unto Others: The Evolution and Psychology of Unselfish Behavior (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1998).