The Two Sides of Being: A Reassessment of Psycho-Physical Dualism

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Meixner, Uwe, The Two Sides of Being: A Reassessment of Psycho-Physical Dualism, Mentis, 2004, ?36.00 (hbk), ISBN 3897853760

Reviewed by Leopold Stubenberg , University of Notre Dame


Meixner has written a forceful and passionate book in defense of mind-body dualism. In chapter 1 he tells us what dualism is. Chapter 2 illuminates the motives for and against dualism. Chapter 3 presents his main argument for dualism. In chapter 4 and 5 he presents 17 more arguments for dualism. Chapters 6 and 7 are devoted to a rebuttal of the main objections to dualism. Chapter 8 presents his own dualistic account of consciousness. Chapter 9 sketches a dualistic theory of agency. And chapter 10 deals with the notion of a self and the evolutionary origin of selves.

The first chapter covers conceptual and metaphysical questions in considerable detail. The main task is to clarify the central notions physicalism and dualism. Here is Meixner’s definition of “physical property”:

A physical property is an item out of the specified set—ask the experts—of fundamental physical properties (which are stipulated to apply only to physical individuals), or a property which is definable on the basis of fundamental physical properties as a specification of the property of being a physical individual. (33)

Much in this definition is original. But the general strategy—here encapsulated by the phrase “ask the experts”—has been tried before. It has been criticized by antiphysicalists and physicalists alike. The problem is this: the experts say one thing today and another thing tomorrow. And there is no telling what they will have to say the day after tomorrow. This is no idle worry—there is no shortage of experts who will, for example, list the property of being a conscious mind as one they need to do their physics. Once this happens this sort of definition can no longer serve a useful purpose.

Mind-body dualism (the specific version of dualism that is at issue here) is the doctrine that “at least one actually existing mental entity is not physical.” (43) This generic version of dualism is true if there is a substantive individual, a property, a state of affairs, or an event that is not physical. Meixner argues that dualism is true because there are nonphysical items in all four of these ontological categories.

Along the way many important and oft neglected issues receive interesting discussions. Here is one example: What does it mean to call a property physical or mental? Properties are abstract entities. So, “clearly,” they are neither physical nor mental. Metaphysical questions like this one are routinely passed over in the philosophy of mind. Meixner’s careful attention to such matters is a welcome corrective.

In chapter II the author asks what motives one might have for wanting dualism/physicalism to be true. Struck by the emotionality and vehemence of much of the anti-dualist rhetoric, he arrives at the following diagnosis:

Why do physicalists fear and hate dualism?… the answer is clear: they fear and hate dualism because they associate it with “the forces of darkness,” with religion in short, which they hate and fear. (61)

And while one may be inclined to see this association as a mere historical contingency, the author argues that the link between salvational religion (his focus is on Christianity) and dualism is indeed a very tight one. “There is no place for materialism in Christianity” is his message to the “Christian materialists.” And his assessment of the non-Christian materialist/functionalist attempts to secure some form of immortality is equally negative: they do not deliver the sort of immortality worth wanting. For they cannot deliver “your personal survival of the destruction of the body.” (80)

But, as Meixner sees it, the ideological warfare between dualism and materialism is not limited to the religious issues of God and immortality. It extends to more mundane issues like sex. He feels that dualism is commonly associated with “a negative attitude to the body and its functions, in particular, towards sexuality…” (80) But nothing could be further from the truth, he admonishes us:

the soul naturally loves the body and is closer united to it than ever human lovers could be to one another in body or soul. The soul is you, and you should, in reason, not act to or believe contrary to its nature, which is your nature. (81)

The possible consequences of our losing sight of the dualist world picture are momentous: “The dualistic enchantment…made the Western culture, and indeed made human culture as a whole….”(82) Materialism—a “dogmatic and oppressive orthodoxy” (83) among whose partisans there is a “lot of arrogance and contempt” (84)—on the other hand, has contributed “practically nothing, if not destruction” to world culture.” (82) So it stands to reason that “if dualism should ever be dead, this might well mean that what it is to be human is dead too.” (82)

I agree with Meixner that the tone of some of the materialist critiques of dualism is appalling—unphilosophical propaganda material—an embarrassment to philosophy. But in his zeal to make us aware of this deplorable situation the style of Meixner’s own writing is, at times, uncomfortably close to those he criticizes so justly.

The third chapter contains a careful exposition of Meixner’s central argument for dualism—the Neo-Cartesian argument. It consists of eight premises and four conclusions. Here I will only mention the crucial third premise of the argument:

There is a possible world in which there exist no physical entities, but in which I exist. (87)

With powerful premises like these arguments for dualism come easily. Perhaps too easily—for some may suspect that this premise is simply a statement of dualism. Be that as it may, why should one accept this proposition? Meixner argues that the universal appeal of external world skepticism teaches us that we must take premise three seriously. In light of the fact that skepticism is a live option even the resolute antiskeptic, like Meixner himself, has to admit that

there is a certain possible world in which I exist and no physical entity exists, and this is not an idle assumption at all, since a pretty good idea of one particular such world can be given: if it were real, it would appear to me, and to everybody else, exactly as the real world does. (97)

According to the final conclusion of the Neo-Cartesian argument “I am a nonphysical substance” (98) where a substance is “a persistent individual wholly present at every moment in which it exists…which is capable…of consciousness or…spontaneous action.” (99) Towards the end of the book one finds a useful short formulation of the Neo-Cartesian Argument. It encapsulates the core of the complex version of the Neo-Cartesian argument sated in chapter 3:

Take any self; being a self, it is a subject of consciousness, and it could be a subject of consciousness in the absence of all physical entities (even subject of that very same consciousness it is actually the subject of); but if this can be, then the self is not a physical entity. (393)

Meixner considers a second way of approaching the central premise of the Neo-Cartesian argument: the fact that I can imagine myself existing disembodied in a physical world. He thinks that this situation is coherently imaginable and describable. And he draws our attention to the work of W.D. Hart (The Engines of the Soul) whose reconstruction of the Cartesian argument is grounded on the detailed imaginability of this situation.

Meixner ends the chapter by noting the currently popular view that zombies (disensouled bodies) provide a better route to dualism than ghosts (disembodied souls). While he agrees that zombies may be a better fit for the contemporary intellectual climate than ghosts, he rejects the idea that ghosts are weaker than zombies when it comes to supporting dualism.

In chapters four and five Meixner presents 17 more arguments for dualism. He finds those arguments in the literature—both old and new—but he refines and reformulates them in his own terms. He does not claim that these many arguments (singly or taken together) prove dualism. But he thinks that these are respectable arguments that offer strong support for dualism. Every argument is explicitly stated as a series of premises and conclusions. Then the validity of the argument is assessed, and once the argument has passed this test, Meixner provides support of all of the premises that strike him as open to challenge. Along the way Meixner frequently points out how and why a materialist philosopher might disagree. This makes for a balanced and stimulating presentation of these controversial arguments. It also leads Meixner to some interesting metaphilosophical reflections. In this vein he writes:

One can characterize philosophy…with some justification as a perennial reasoned controversy about what is reasonable in fundamental (often purely conceptual) questions. Perhaps philosophy has to be that way. If so, then this is likely to entitle both dualists and physicalists, even though their conflict cannot be (philosophically) decided, to being reasonably reasonable (without either side being able to lord it over the other); both sides may be within their rights, both may be able to work coherently within their respective conceptual frameworks, both frameworks having their advantages and disadvantages, none being, regarded as a whole, rationally preferable to the other. (181) [And he quickly adds] But, for the time being, I still have hopes that dualism can actually be shown to be more reasonable philosophically than physicalism. (181)

I’ll single out Meixner’s reconstruction of Searle’s Chinese Room Argument for comment because in this particular case his rendition of the argument does not do justice to the original. Of course Meixner is well aware that Searle did not intend his argument to support dualism. But since this reorientation of the argument is clearly marked and not implausible it is beyond reproach. The problem with Meixner’s reconstructed argument is that it crucially relies on a premise to which there is no analogue in Searle’s argument. Meixner’s second premise reads:

If understanding Chinese is a physical property, then it is not possible, not even in principle, that a Chinese Room acts (i.e., functions) perfectly as if it understood Chinese and does not understand Chinese. (172)

This crucial premise allows him to move from the fact (also accepted by Searle) that it’s possible for a Chinese Room to function as if it understood Chinese, without doing so, to the conclusion that understanding Chinese is not a physical property.

Meixner acknowledges that this premise is not a premise of the original Chinese Room Argument. And he admits that Searle would reject this premise. But he misunderstands Searle’s reasons for opposing this premise. Pace Meixner, Searle does not hold that the property of understanding Chinese “is bound to human “flesh and blood,” more specifically: to human brains.” (175) According to Searle, any system with the necessary “causal powers” can understand Chinese—and since we don’t know what these powers are we are not in a position to single out those systems that are incapable of instantiating this property. Thus Searle’s reason for rejecting Meixner’s second premise is not an implausible materialistic “chauvinism.” Instead it is based on his rejection of behaviorism and operationalism. Since materialists are free to reject behaviorism/operationalism, they can hold that “a Chinese Room acts (i.e., functions) perfectly as if it understood Chinese and does not understand Chinese,” (172) while insisting that understanding Chinese is a physical property. So there are two issues here. Meixner’s argument contains a Chinese Room, but it is not a version of the Chinese Room Argument. And, second, once it becomes clear that the materialist opposition to Meixner’s second premise is not grounded in an implausible version of Chauvinism, but in a plausible rejection of beahviorism/operationalism, the second premise starts to looks suspicious. Meixner devotes one paragraph to its support (top of page 174). But it boils down to saying that it just can’t be any other way and it must be this way. More is needed here to get this crucial premise afloat.

Chapter six is a survey of recent antidualistic arguments. Dennett and McGinn are the main villains. The arguments of Chalmers (as opponent of substance dualism), the Churchlands, Kim, are treated much more briefly. Meixner is not impressed. Having engaged in a sixty- page battle with his chosen opponents, he is left with the impression of

argumentative unfairness and conceptual carelessness, of misrepresentation and detraction, of dogmatic metaphysical inflexibility hiding behind ostentatious scientificness, of mere repugnance toward the idea of dualism. (257)

As Meixner sees it, many materialists choose to attack a pitiful caricature of dualism, viz., the doctrine that we are made up of two kinds of stuff: matter and some sort of immaterial mind or soul stuff. Meixner can barely contain the “savage indignation” (251) that this “idiotic opinion” (243) arouses in him. Dualism, he assures us, “has no truck with immaterial stuff.” It is the doctrine that “at least one mental entity is not physical” (233). And substance dualism is the doctrine that “at least one actually existing mental substantial individual is not physical.” (43) The repugnant view of “stuffing dualism” results if you think that substances must be made up of some sort of stuff—material stuff or nonmaterial stuff, as the case may be. But Meixner assures us that “substances don’t have to be “stuffed,” least of all extensionlessly.” (200). How could one fail to see this obvious point? He offers the following speculation in reply:

Could it be that the only basic sense of the word “substance” that can enter the minds of some physicalists is the chemical or pharmaceutical sense of that word…according to which a substance is indeed a stuff? But that chemical and pharmaceutical sense of the world “substance” is simply not the relevant sense when one is talking about substance dualism. (201)

Meixner isolates one other central mistake that runs through a large number of anti-dualist arguments: it’s the thought that, given the causal closure of the physical, mentality—dualistically conceived—cannot play a causal role in the physical world. But, according to Meixner, this is a simple mistake. Causal overdetermination is unproblematic. He briefly presents his account of “nomologically psycho-physically coordinated causation.” The extended argument for this view is presented in his book on causation, Theorie der Kausalität, (Mentis: Paderborn 2001).

In chapter seven Meixner confronts the claim that dualism is anti-scientific. He concludes that this is not true. Meixner argues that the sciences of the mind could continue as usual even if all mind scientists were to become dualists. A persistent confusion of science with physicalism (which is a world-view, a metaphysics) makes it difficult to see this. And he insists that it is no less important to not confuse science with one of the sciences, viz., physics. Once one accepts that psychology, for example, is a science, then one can see that “metaphysical dualism cannot be detrimental for science, that it cannot be anti-scientific, since methodological dualism is a necessary prerequisite for there being a science of consciousness in the world at all.” (266) In section 3 of the chapter Meixner does address the worry that dualism blocks scientific explanation. He counters this suggestion by providing a sketch of an evolutionary explanation of consciousness. But the materialist may have other explanatory tasks in mind Richard Taylor and Peter van Inwagen, for example, are baffled by the question how anything, any substance, can be conscious. And to be told that nonphysical substances can be conscious because they are the sorts of substances that can be conscious is no help. It’s true that these two philosophers, especially van Inwagen, are equally puzzled by the question how a material substance can be conscious. But in the case of matter there may be hope: as physics tells us more and more about matter, some light might possibly be shed on the question how it can become conscious. But there is no analogous systematic and growing body of knowledge about nonphysical substances. Hence the hope that, eventually, we might learn something about how a nonphysical substance can be conscious, seems quite unfounded. This is one way in which the dualist may seem to be worse off than the materialist when confronting the question: How can anything be conscious?

In chapter eight Meixner presents a sketch of his own dualistic theory of consciousness which he labels interactionist parallelism:

The theory says that conscious events and their physical causal representatives are parallel to each other, one-to-one, in the sense one associates with the traditional doctrine of psycho-physical parallelism: though they are correlated, there is no causal relationship between any conscious event and its physical causal representative…That is, there are no causal relationships directed along the verticals between the parallels; but directed sideways from the verticals, in both directions (to the conscious events and from the conscious events), there are lots of causal relationships between conscious events and physical events. The theory, therefore, combines parallelism with interactionism. (313)

Meixner states this theory in ten principles, of which I shall only mention two:

C2: There are conscious events, and no conscious event is a physical event. (292)
C4: For every conscious event y there is a physical event x such that x is a causal representative of y. (297)

Meixner takes C4 to be the pivotal principle of his theory. The crucial notion employed in C4 is that of a causal representative. “Events x and y are causal representatives of each other if, and only if, they have the same causes and effects.” (296) Why accept C4? Meixner thinks that it has been empirically confirmed and not empirically disconfirmed. Moreover it is presupposed by the large scientific enterprise called “the hunt for the NCC”. Thus he thinks that it is plausible to assume that the correlation between conscious events and physical events that causally represent each other is lawlike.

But doesn’t C4 entail the identity theory? After all, it’s just a way of stating a Davidsonian criterion of event identity. Meixner resists this move by arguing that a conscious and a physical event that causally represent each other differ in their properties, notwithstanding the fact that they have the same overall causal profiles. Conscious events have a qualitative dimension (they have qualia) and the have a subjective dimension (their qualia are always qualia for someone) (see 306). But physical events lack both of these dimensions. So conscious events are not identical with physical events. The difference in properties blocks the identity, but it does not block the nomological supervenience of conscious events on physical events. But this is a consequence that Meixner is happy to take on board. Supervenience does not compromise dualism.

If the materialist wants to resist this conclusion they have to embrace qualia eliminativism. Dennett’s efforts to make qualia eliminativism plausible do not impress Meixner. In his characteristically forceful way he sums up this part of the discussion as follows:

The physicalist denial of qualia deserves to be called “brutish” not only on account of its brutality to a vital part of our common humanity, but also because it certainly appears to be a mere instance of brute dogmatic stupidity… (309)

But sophisticated materialists do not have to rely on dogma alone—Meixner can discern one actual argument (albeit a bad one) in support of qualia eliminativism. Roughly, the thought is this: causal representatives of each other cannot differ in real properties, for if they did they could not be causally equivalent. So the alleged extra properties of conscious events—the qualia—cannot be real properties. Hence there aren’t really qualia and we can go ahead and identify events which are causal representatives of each other. There is much in this argument that makes Meixner unhappy, but he focuses on just one crucial idea. Why think that the extra properties—the qualia—do not make a causal difference? His thought is this: the conscious events have some causally relevant extra properties; but they also lack some of the causally relevant properties of the physical events that are their causal representatives. And couldn’t it be the case that the causal plus afforded to the conscious events by their qualia is precisely counterbalanced by the causal minus resulting from their lacking certain physical properties of their counterparts? So the materialist’s assumption that the extra properties of the conscious events must be causally inert is shown to be baseless.

Meixner’s discussion of C4 has also revealed his reason for endorsing C2: conscious events have properties that no physical event has: qualia and subjectivity (or forness).

With the central principles of his interactionist parallelism in place, Meixner is prepared to take on another challenge: Why would such a bizarre setup ever have evolved? The short answer is this: to make her children truly successful Mother Nature must make them into genuine decision makers. (314) A genuine decision maker is one who can deliberate on the basis of nondeterminative information. (316) Now how do you build a genuine decision maker who can deliberate on the basis of nondeterminative information? First, you make sure that the information has a format that the decision maker can understand. That is done by attaching qualia to the information carrying events. For the qualia “define the conscious event as the natural meaning it is.” (324) Second, you must make sure that these natural meanings are going to be appreciated by the decision maker—they must become something to the decision maker, they must be something for the decision maker. This is done by imbuing the information with forness. The information “has, as it were, an address written on it.” (317) This explains the evolution of the two extra properties of conscious events: qualia and forness. But there is more: What sort of a thing can appreciate this sort of information, these natural meanings, and can use them in deliberation? Only a nonphysical entity!

Thus it is indeed the case that Nature herself put the ghosts in the machines, those marvelous caretakers and guardians who actually love the thing they are put in charge of and who will see it through many dangers, toils, and snares, relinquishing it only with the utmost reluctance. (321)

And this is why there are nonphysical souls and why certain physical events in the brain are nomologically linked to corresponding conscious events that come furnished with qualia and an inbuilt direction toward the deliberating soul.

There is much more in this chapter. Along the way Meixner provides interesting discussions of the (non)problem of causal overdetermination—an issue that the interactionist parallelist obviously must confront; and he has interesting things to say about the relationship of psychophysical interaction and the conservation laws and causal closure principles. All of this material is thought-provoking and original. But here I have to pass it over.

Chapter nine is devoted to developing a dualistic theory of agency. What is it for you, i.e., for an embodied soul—a nonphysical substance that experiences, deliberates, and makes decisions—to act? For an agent to act is to contribute to the determination of the future in a situation in which it is otherwise nomologically undetermined which of a number of different futures will come to pass (see 365, 376). Why believe that there is true agency? The existence of consciousness suggests as much. For without agency the ability to make decisions based on conscious information would be useless. And we can assume that consciousness is not a “pointless excrescence of evolution.” (366) Hence we have reason to think that determinism is false—a view that strikes Meixner as well-supported on other grounds as well.

The act of selection by which the agent narrows down the number of nomologically possible futures is best understood as an exercise of agent causation. Since the actualization of any of the many nomologically possible futures is in accord with the laws of nature, this causal input of nonphysical souls poses no threat to science. The notion of agent causation has struck many of its proponents, and most of its opponents, as somewhat mysterious. But Meixner sees no problem here:

What remains rather mysterious to me is this: what, according to Dennett (and many others), is supposed to be so mysterious about agent-causation [?] The concept seems clear enough, doesn’t it? I am truly puzzled, especially if I compare agent causation with event-causation, which seems to me (and not only to me) . rather mysterious matter indeed. (378)

Meixner concludes the chapter by defining two distinct notions of action—an “internal” and an “external” one. The internal notion focuses on the agent’s narrowing down of the space of possibilities by selecting a subset of all the nomologically possible continuations at a given point in time. The external notion focuses on the event that ensues as a causal consequences of the agent’s decision. He summarizes the relationship between these two notions as follows:

An action in the second sense is an outcome or manifestation of an action in the first sense; an action in the first sense is that by which an agent makes an action in the second sense occur. (388)

Different contexts will favor the one or the other notion. Meixner sees no need to make a choice between the two notions.

Chapter ten deals with selves and their evolutionary origins. Selves are nonphysical substances “which are subjects both of consciousness and of agency. (391) Persons are “rational selves”. (391) And a “soul, qua soul, is a (substantial, nonphysical) self that belongs to an organism.” (398). (Reflections on evolution lead Meixner to countenance a “wider sense” of the word “soul” according to which “not only selves can be souls but also substances incapable of consciousness.” (407)). Bundles, collections, abstractions, and similar constructions fall short of selfhood. Only the assumption that selves are highly unified enduring individuals explains “why selves have a fundamental interest in surviving as numerically the same, enduring individual.”(396)

How did souls “enter” the world? They evolved along with their organism. And the connection between souls is effected by natural laws. Here is how one might think of the evolution of the soul:

The nomological structure of the world is such that the emergence of organisms with selves is nomologically possible and under certain circumstances nomologically necessary. And then the right accidents happened, making the relevant laws, which had been dormant so far, operative. And—pop—there it was: the first organism with a self, i.e., with a subject of consciousness and agency, which, being the organism’s self, is centered on the organism, but which is a nonphysical enduring individual nonetheless. (400)

Meixner appreciates the traditional view according to which the soul is there to serve the organism. But he encourages us to contemplate his unorthodox view:

It seems best to consider these relationships symmetrical. The organism belongs to a substance—to a self if the substance is a subject of consciousness and agency—as much as the substance belongs to the organism. An organism is there for a substance and in its service as much as that substance is there for the organism and serving it. (405)

Viewing the subjects of evolution as “composita, constituted in consequence of natural law, consisting of a substance and and organism belonging to each other” (407) changes the face of evolution: now there are real interests and real purposes involved, viz., those of the substances united to the evolving organisms. And it now becomes possible to see that organisms “are designed to be the homes of substances, to be the vehicles of substances” (408) rather than merely being designed “to resist their own dissolution.” (Dennett’s phrase, cited on page 401)

There follow further metaphysical speculations about the evolution of ensouled creatures. The book closes with some Schopenhauerian remarks on ethics and eschatology. They are uncharacteristically brief and obscure. Rather than report on them I shall close with a brief quotation that succinctly encapsulates some of the main ideas that Meixner has put forth in this challenging work:

In my eyes consciousness is an irreducibly psychological feature of selves, where both selves and their feature of consciousness arise, according to psycho-physical laws, from an appropriate physical basis. (262)