The Unity of Consciousness

Placeholder book cover

Tim Bayne, The Unity of Consciousness, Oxford University Press, 2010, 341pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199215386.

Reviewed by Sydney Shoemaker, Cornell University


Tim Bayne's The Unity of Consciousness is far and away the most comprehensive treatment of its topic that I know of. It is in many ways impressive, though in some ways puzzling (I will get to what I find puzzling in it later). One of the things that is impressive is the author's grasp of an enormous body of psychological and physiological literature. There are detailed discussions of, among other things, anosognosia, schizophrenia, multiplicity (dissociative identity disorder), hypnosis and the "hidden observer," and the split-brain syndrome. The list of references is some forty pages long, and the majority of the items on it are from the psychological and physiological literature. Bayne writes clearly and provides helpful summaries, but (judging from my own case) those not familiar with the technical literature will find some of the discussion of these matters rather hard going -- he is a bit too sparing in his explanations of psychological and physiological terminology. But his treatment of these matters is careful and often illuminating.

The consciousness Bayne is concerned with is phenomenal consciousness, and the unity at issue is phenomenological unity. Phenomenally conscious states are states there is "something it is like" to be in. He offers a "mereological" account of phenomenal unity. For phenomenal states to be unified is for them to be parts of, or subsumed by, a larger phenomenal state. And he defends the view, the "Unity Thesis," that "Necessarily, for any conscious subject of the conscious experience (S) and any time (t), the simultaneous conscious states that S has at t will be subsumed by a single conscious state -- that subject's total conscious state" (p. 16). He says that the main evidence for this view is provided by introspection. In the first part of the book he takes the subject of conscious states to be a human being. Where this is assumed, the unity thesis is clearly empirical rather than a priori (despite the "necessarily" in his formulation of it), and a good deal of the book is devoted to answering empirical challenges to it. Here is where we get the discussions of schizophrenia, multiplicity, the split-brain syndrome, etc.

In discussing these matters Bayne takes himself to be arguing against received views in cognitive science. Most accounts of these phenomena take them to involve disunity of a kind that is incompatible with the unity thesis. Bayne allows that these phenomena involve kinds of disunity -- there will be failures of access unity, representational unity, and unity of self-consciousness. But he is insistent that they are compatible with the unity thesis, which is about phenomenal unity. This requires him to reject the going accounts of what happens in cases of multiple personality, split brains, etc. So, for example, he argues against both the "two streams" account of split brain cases and what he calls the partial unity model, and proposes instead what he calls the "switch model," according to which "we should think of consciousness in the split-brain as moving or switching from one hemisphere to another. Although both hemispheres can process information concurrently, they take turns supporting consciousness" (p. 210). The switch model is also invoked in the discussion of hypnosis, in opposition to the view that hidden observer subjects have two streams that run in parallel.

Here is the first thing I find puzzling about the book. Bayne is usually very careful in his claims about what the evidence shows and what his arguments show, and is very fair minded in his treatment of opposing views. In criticizing a view he normally rebuts numerous criticisms of it before offering the criticism he accepts. He emphasizes that there is a lot that we don't yet know about these matters and that such conclusions as we draw must be tentative. Rather than claim that an opposing view has been decisively refuted, he is usually content to claim that the view faces formidable challenges. And all he claims for his "switch model" is that it "ought to be regarded as a serious rival to the two streams and partial unity models," not that the evidence "points unequivocally in favor of the switch model" (p. 220). Given this, it would seem that the most he is entitled to assert is that the unity thesis may well be true -- that it is not clearly refuted by the phenomena he discusses. But what he repeatedly concludes is that, as he says immediately after the passage just quoted, "the unity thesis is secure."

In the last part of the book, however, Bayne moves to a conception of the subject of experience on which the unity thesis is secure, because it is a priori. (He doesn't explicitly say it is a priori, but this seems implicit in what he says on p. 281 when contrasting the new conception with the previous one on which it is a posteriori.) The subjects of experience are selves, and he argues against the "animalist" view that selves are human organisms, a view that was assumed in the earlier parts of the book. The main argument against the animalist view is that it cannot handle the possibility of Cerberus, a single animal with two heads and housing two selves. He also argues against the psychological, neo-Lockean, view, which he takes to identify selves with minds, construed as "networks of causally and intentionally integrated mental states" (p. 275). This is rejected on the grounds that a single mind can support two different streams of consciousness. He says that "we need a notion of the self according to which the relationship between the self and the unity of consciousness is constitutive" and that this requires a phenomenalist conception of the self; "we need to construct selves out of streams of consciousness" (p. 281).

Here I should observe that it seems to me misleading to contrast the phenomenalist view of the self with the psychological, neo-Lockean, view. It seems a version of the psychological view, rather than a competitor of it. It certainly views the identity of selves as consisting in psychological facts, for phenomenal consciousness is plainly something psychological. I think that most recent psychological theorists would reject the characterization of their view as one that identifies selves with minds; for one thing, they take selves (persons) to have bodily characteristics that minds are not taken to have. Supposing that a psychological theorist has a place in her ontology for minds, she may or may not allow that a single mind can support different streams of phenomenal consciousness and, supposing she does, may or may not hold that a single mind can be associated with different selves. What we have here are different versions of the psychological view, of which the phenomenalist view is one. (There are other versions. A view somewhat similar to the phenomenalist view holds that the normal condition of a self involves phenomenal unity and that it must contain mechanisms that tend to generate and preserve such unity, but that cases of phenomenal disunity are possible.)

Having declared himself in favor of a phenomenalist conception of the self, Bayne goes on to consider different versions of it. Naïve phenomenalism holds that selves are just identical with streams of consciousness. Characteristically, Bayne defends this view against a number of criticisms before hitting on the one he thinks is fatal to it: it cannot do the "bridge-building" needed to solve the problem of phenomenal gaps. Another version of phenomenalism is substrate phenomenalism, which identifies the self with "the underlying substrate that is responsible for generating the stream of consciousness -- the machinery in which consciousness is grounded" (p. 287). This he rejects on the grounds that "because there is no a priori guarantee that a single consciousness-generating mechanism will produce only one stream of consciousness at a time, the substrate phenomenalist cannot ensure that simultaneous co-subjective experiences will be phenomenally unified" (p. 288). The version of phenomenalism Bayne favors is virtual phenomenalism. This holds that selves are "merely intentional entities -- entities whose identity is determined by the cognitive architecture underlying a stream of consciousness" (p. 289). The self is "a virtual object that is brought into being by de se representation," and "the functional role of de se representation guarantees that the boundaries of the virtual self are limned by the boundaries of the phenomenal field (at least at a time)" (ibid.).

This view eludes my understanding. Talk of intentional objects can be a useful façon de parler for talking about the contents of intentional states, but I do not think that an inventory of the things there are should include a class of things that are "merely" intentional objects. Bayne says that it should not be thought that on his view "the self is fictional in the way Hercule Poirot and other creatures of fiction are" (p. 293). The reason for this appears to be that while we can contrast the mode of existence of Poirot with that of real detectives, "there is no kind of real self with which our kinds of selves could be contrasted, for it is in the very nature of selves to be virtual." But there is a contrast, on his view, with the mode of existence of real things of other sorts, and it is not clear why that isn't enough to make selves fictional.

Given that Bayne rejects the animalist view and holds a phenomenalist view on which the phenomenal unity is constitutive of the self, it is not clear why he devotes a sizable portion of the book to defending the unity thesis on the assumption that selves (subjects of experience) are human organisms and that the unity thesis is a posteriori and contingent. That is the part of the book that is most likely to be of interest to psychologists, yet its underlying assumption is one he ends up rejecting. This is another of the things I find puzzling about the book.

Let's return to the mereological account of unity of consciousness which Bayne holds throughout the book. This says that conscious states are phenomenally unified just in case they are parts of a single conscious state. This is also put by saying that "two conscious states are phenomenally unified when, and only when, they are co-subsumed" (p. 20), i.e., there is a single conscious state that subsumes both. Unless accompanied by some account of what this parthood or subsumption consists in this tells us little. And I cannot find that Bayne offers such an account. He has various things to say about this relationship. Its absence appears to preclude integration of the contents of representational states (p. 273). And he favors a "holistic" view according to which "the components of a subject's total phenomenal state are brought into being as the constituents of that state" (p. 236). Both of these claims would go with a representational account of phenomenal unity, but he rejects representational accounts and seems unwilling to offer any sort of functionalist account. So I was left in the dark about what this unity relation is.

There is much more in this book than I have mentioned here. It is the most thorough discussion of the unity of consciousness there is, and anyone interested in the topic should read it.