The Unthought Debt: Heidegger and the Hebraic Heritage

Placeholder book cover

Marlène Zarader, The Unthought Debt: Heidegger and the Hebraic Heritage, trans. Bettina Bergo, Stanford University Press, 2006, 255pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0804736863.

Reviewed by Peter E. Gordon, Harvard University


Marlène Zarader's important work of Heidegger-criticism, The Unthought Debt, is not exactly new; it was originally published in French in 1990 under the title, La dette impensée: Heidegger et l'héritage hébraïque, and those of us who had the good fortune to read the book in its original form have been citing it and recommending it with much enthusiasm to our colleagues. We can now be grateful to Bettina Bergo for the precision and elegance of her translation, which will, one hopes, now make the book available to a far wider readership.

The questions that guide Zarader's investigation are at once intriguing and highly controversial: Why does Heidegger appear so reluctant to grant the tradition of "Hebraic" thought its rightful place alongside the Greek tradition in the philosophical history of the West? What is the logic by which the Hebraic tradition is occluded from Heidegger's conception of that history? And does not this occlusion seem doubly perplexing when one considers the -- in Zarader's view -- strong affinity between Heidegger's own patterns of philosophical reflection and those of the specifically Hebraic tradition? What, more precisely, does that affinity consist in? The core message of Zarader's book is not only that Heidegger fails to acknowledge this second and non-Greek resource for philosophy; it is that Heidegger actively reduces this heritage to "speechlessness" even while -- and here is the central irony -- the Hebraic understanding of key philosophical categories would appear closely to resemble the key categories of Heidegger's own philosophy. Heidegger's unspoken and unrecognized -- even suppressed -- philosophical-historical investment in the Hebraic heritage thus comprises what Zarader calls an "unthought debt."

To be sure, the basic message of the book as summarized above is not without scholarly precedent: A number of other readers (including Stanley Rosen, Paul Ricoeur, and Jacques Derrida) have commented upon the "Hebraic" features of Heidegger's philosophy, while others have noted Heidegger's strange avoidance of the Hebraic tradition. Ricoeur, for example, in remarks Zarader quotes in her introduction, notes that: "What has often astonished me about Heidegger is that he would have systematically eluded … the confrontation with the block of Hebraic thought. He sometimes reflected on the basis of the Gospels and of Christian theology, but always avoided the Hebraic cluster, which is the absolute stranger to the Greek discourse …" (Quoted in Zarader, 7). Yet according to others scholars, the deeper question is why Heidegger would seem to avoid this body of thought that nonetheless animates his own work: Rosen writes of Heidegger's debt to the "Hebraic" almost as if it did not require further explanation. A great many others (including John MacQuarrie, Leo Strauss, Richard Kröner, and Franz Rosenzweig) have discerned the theological strain in Heidegger's thinking without seeking to identify it with any one religious tradition: Rosenzweig spoke of the "earthly path of revelation" as a legacy shared in common by Christians, pagans, and Jews.

What distinguishes Zarader's inquiry from those of other scholars is not only its focus and length -- previous writers have only remarked on this troubled affinity, they have not made it the central object of study -- it also makes an unprecedented and earnest attempt to expose in a quasi-systematic fashion the most important facets of this "debt" by comparing Heidegger's philosophy with the global commitments of what Zarader calls the "Hebraic Heritage." This alone makes Zarader's book especially deserving of attention, especially so for those of us who remain unconvinced by the charge (made famous by Levinas) that Heidegger's philosophy is the pure and uncontaminated expression of the Greek tradition alone. For Zarader, the Levinasian interpretation is "deformed" (yet she is clearly conflicted about stating this too bluntly, and she warns us off from this word with quotation marks): Levinas "forgets" (quotation marks again) "all that which in Being, in Heidegger's sense, might be liable to approximate it to the Other, and, more broadly, all that which, in Heidegger's work, could evoke the biblical universe." (145) Levinas is therefore tempted "even to exaggerate" the distance between Heidegger and the Hebraic, even while the exaggeration is deployed "not in order to caricature Heidegger's thought, but on the contrary to expose that which is most proper to it" (which is to say, the ethical). (146) Zarader refuses to follow Levinas in this exaggeration; instead, she seeks to expose the proximity that even Heidegger himself wished to deny.

The Unthought Debt is organized into two parts. The first half begins with an excursus on the "rule of interpretation" that governs Heidegger's conception of the history of philosophy: the general rule is that of a basic "split" between the originary and the derivative, where the latter is the path of metaphysical error stretching all the way back to the inception of Western philosophy in Greece. As Zarader reminds us, Heidegger pushes this errancy "ever farther back" to Aristotle, Plato, and eventually to Parmenides, until eventually he concludes that metaphysics begins at the very start of Greek philosophy such that "Heidegger finishes by stepping in some sense outside of the Greek itself." At this point the question arises as to how Heidegger can imagine an other to metaphysical history: an originary tradition of (non-metaphysical) thinking. As Zarader explains, the problem is that Heidegger seems to acknowledge only one origin: if philosophical history remains essentially Greek, then any tradition beyond the Greek remains essentially unthought. This rule of interpretation governs virtually all of Heidegger's writing. And it renders Heidegger's non-acknowledgement of his debt to the Hebraic heritage all the more perplexing. Zarader follows this excursus with three comparative essays that seek to show how Heidegger imagines three categories of philosophy -- language, thought, and interpretation -- in a fashion strongly reminiscent of the Hebrew Bible. About language, Zarader argues that Heidegger shares with the "biblical universe" the view that language is a mode of revelation. For "[t]he central idea around which the entire Jewish experience of language is organized is that language does not have the status of an instrument." Instead, it is "the crucible of all that is: it is in language that all beings are first held; language is that from which beings can break forth into presence" (and so forth). (43) Such a conception, Zarader suggests, bears a remarkable similarity to the Heideggerian understanding, in which language makes possible "the founding of Being." (41) Moreover, Heidegger's conception of the poet closely resembles the biblical image of the prophet, as, e.g., a messenger. Similar affinities are discovered between the Heideggerian and (Hebraic) biblical categories of "thought" and of "interpretation." The chapters are exceedingly rich and forbid easy summary.

In the second half of the book, Zarader addresses more directly the three "problems" that might seem to obstruct her analysis: 1) Does Heidegger's concern with Being allow for any comparison with the Hebraic conception of God? The answer here seems to be that certain key features of Being bear a close resemblance to Kabbalistic imagery, especially the figurative account of the divine essence as a hidden plenitude whose withdrawal is the condition for the world's appearance. 2) If this is more than mere resemblance and we imagine Heidegger actually drew upon biblical concepts, what was the vehicle of this transmission? Zarader's answer here is hardly surprising: Heidegger absorbs Hebraic patterns of thought via Christianity, but then "forgets" the specifically "Old Testament" character of the concepts in question. Here Zarader takes care to note that the fault for this oblivion does not lie with Heidegger alone: it belongs to a fundamental pattern in Christian self-understanding to regard the Jewish background as superseded and no longer of independent interest. 3) In the final chapter Zarader lays down a series of discerning and quite subtle objections to Derrida's understanding of Heidegger as presented in De l'esprit. Unlike Derrida (whose acumen she acknowledges), Zarader believes that Heidegger's error is not to have acknowledged the true sources of his own more "originary" reflections. Hence the closing irony (in Zarader's words), that:

the thinker who, more amply than any other, restored to Western thought the determinations central to the Hebraic universe is precisely he who never said anything about the Hebraic as such, who, more massively than any other, effaced it from thought and, more broadly, from the West itself. (185)

But what is "the Hebraic"? At this point let me forgo any further summary and instead address what I take to be the book's most questionable assumption: the unity or coherence it wants to ascribe to something so vast and evidently complicated as the "Hebraic heritage." Here I confess that my admiration for Zarader's questions gives way to skepticism regarding some of her bolder suggestions. Let me articulate this skepticism with a simple question: What is the "Hebraic" heritage? The emphasis -- "the" -- is the signal for all of my doubts; yet it is important to note that this determinate article is absolutely indispensable to Zarader's project.

Zarader describes the Hebraic heritage as "a gigantic and proliferating cluster." In it

we find inextricably interwoven a language (Hebrew) a text (Bible) a tradition of thinking and writing (Talmudic, midrashic, kabbalistic, etc., literatures), a religion (Judaism) and finally a people with its history and its myths. (9)

But do these form a single fabric with one distinctive pattern? And what makes its pattern distinct from others? Zarader is ready to admit that there are "exchanges" between traditions. This is prudent; for who could deny the philosophical cross-pollination between the "Hebraic-biblical" and the "Hellenistic"? But her analysis strives to contain -- and logically it requires that she contain -- such exchanges, since she is intent upon claiming that there is something specific and identifiably Hebraic in Heidegger's work whose identification he has suppressed. Zarader is therefore forced to describe the contents of the Hebraic tradition, and even in describing them she betrays a conviction that they remain analytically distinct: hence what she calls "external influences" (as if the "internal" admitted of separate definition). Stranger still is the presupposition that the Hebraic heritage is "preserved and transmitted -- not in a pure way, to be sure, but perhaps purer than elsewhere -- in Jewish memory." And therefore "this heritage (like every heritage) is an indissociable fabric made of language and thought" such that we can deduce "the specific relationship that a people maintains with its universe." (11) In sum, the Hebraic heritage is nothing less than a "signifying totality." (11)

Here lies a danger and a host of questions. By what logic can a tradition be defined as a totality of significance? Is a "tradition" even a philosophical concept? Is it something with borders, boundaries, an enclosed region of space? Can a body of thought exhibit this sort of geometry? Can it truly be separate from what we might fear to call its "exterior"? And can we describe it as nourishing itself through time by means of communal memory -- "not in a pure way" but "perhaps purer than elsewhere"? Supporting Zarader's admirable efforts throughout her otherwise thoughtful and scrupulously philosophical book is the strangely unphilosophical assumption that there is indeed a self-identical and transhistorical object under discussion that we can characterize simply as -- "the Hebraic." Yet her efforts to characterize that object are disabled by a number of curious (if perhaps unavoidable) restrictions. Most of the authorities called upon to define the Hebraic heritage belong to the twentieth century, which may prompt the worry that we are not dealing with a "heritage" itself but with a certain eminently modernist construction of it. And many of those authorities are already philosophers and philologians whose conceptions of the "heritage" are anything but "pure" since they are developed almost inevitably within the discourse of the modern West, a discourse which itself is both Hellenistic and Hebraic at once. More worrisome is the authoritative position Zarader seems ready to award Gershom Scholem as the spokesperson for "the Hebraic" as such, although Scholem's interpretations are famously controversial. (Incidentally, the youthful Scholem was swept up within the same post-Nietzschean philosophical currents that moved Heidegger, which renders the use of Scholem's contemporary writings on Judaism as independent support for a resemblance between Heidegger and the Hebraic somewhat circular). More dubious still is the fact that Zarader's evidentiary texts are confined chiefly to the Kabbalah, to such a degree that the Kabbalistic tradition becomes almost identical in meaning to the "the Hebraic." Granted, "the Kabbalistic tradition" is a pleonasm: since "Kabbalah" in Hebrew means "the tradition" or "what is received." But this cannot license an identification between them, and we should remember that since rabbinic times many exponents of normative Judaism have regarded the Kabbalah with some ambivalence and have even charged it with heresy. (In fact, recent post-Scholemian scholarship has suggested that certain key motifs in Kabbalistic thought may derive from Christianity, and it should be remembered that throughout the medieval period Kabbalah was -- like alchemy -- at once an esoteric and popular practice transcending exclusive religious identities). Zarader resorts rather too frequently to Kabbalistic examples, yet only once does she note that the Kabbalah worked its way into the German philosophical tradition via Schelling ("whom Heidegger read so assiduously"). (168). So the question remains whether Heidegger's bond is really to "the Hebraic" as such or only to certain motifs and strains of thinking that were, from their beginning, perhaps, passing back and forth among several traditions while belonging essentially or exclusively to none.

And why, after all, do we require this strange circumlocution, "the Hebraic?" What is almost never used in the book would be the near-synonym: "the Jewish," maybe for reasons of disciplinary propriety, since the latter might have carried all of the unwanted associations of social or national-identity, the complications of history and politics. What is also never admitted outright is the rhetorical-political effect of claiming that Heidegger is suppressing his bond to Hebraic thinking and that he has conspired even "to reduce that heritage to speechlessness." What is the pathos of this claim? Clearly -- how can this be forgotten? -- it is a pathos due to Heidegger's history, and what we now can call justifiably his anti-Semitism. Since these associations can hardly be avoided and could even be said to operate as the moral horizon for the book, one might have expected Zarader to offer some comment upon their significance. It is surprising, then, that notwithstanding their subterranean influence she leaves them altogether unspoken, perhaps because -- even in a book that indicts Heidegger with "suppression" or "forgetting" -- they would disrupt the illusion of a purely intellectual inquiry.

The final irony is that Heidegger himself relies everywhere in his own work upon just these holistic-romantic notions of "heritage" and "tradition." For Heidegger, the chief object of both retrieval and destruction was "Greek philosophy", a contrivance, albeit a necessary one, which already conspired to suppress all of the differences and alterities that might otherwise have complicated Heidegger's grand narrative of ontological oblivion. As early as Being and Time he invoked the notion of a "proper" (or "authentic") heritage, one which each people was to take over from its past and renew. But what demands that "a people" (notice the singular noun) obey such patterns of national-holistic continuity? For Heidegger it seemed somehow a logical premise: it first appears in his brilliant analysis of the artisan's workshop: that local world in which all is known through the intimacy of use and each tool seemed to fit without difficulty into a "holistic network of significance." Yet this very premise lies at the roots of an unthinking historical-philosophical romanticism according to which the world is organized into separable and coherent intellectual traditions, each of them with their own "memory" or "people" to carry them forward. It is therefore a matter of some frustration that Zarader, in her otherwise thought provoking and insightful analysis of Heidegger, seems ultimately to recapitulate his most questionable logic, since even as she faults Heidegger for failing to recognize his debt to another philosophical "heritage" she affords that very concept an unquestioned legitimacy.