The Value and Limits of Academic Speech: Philosophical, Political, and Legal Perspectives

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Donald Alexander Downs and Chris W. Surprenant (eds.), The Value and Limits of Academic Speech: Philosophical, Political, and Legal Perspectives, Routledge, 2018, 357pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138479890.

Reviewed by Frederick Schauer, University of Virginia School of Law


In 1950 the great American judge, Learned Hand, opined in a free speech case that

the interest, which the [First Amendment] guards, and which gives it its importance, presupposes that there are no orthodoxies -- religious, political, economic, or scientific -- which are immune from debate and dispute. Back of that is the assumption -- itself an orthodoxy, and the one permissible exception -- that truth will be most likely to emerge, if no limitations are imposed on utterances that can with any plausibility be regarded as efforts to present grounds for accepting or rejecting propositions whose truth the utterer asserts, or denies. (International Brotherhood 1950)

Although Hand's remarks about freedom of speech and the First Amendment restate the standard view about the so-called open marketplace of ideas as a facilitator of the search for truth (Popper 1966; Schauer 1982), what is unique and important about Hand's words is the frank acknowledgment that the value of free speech is itself an orthodoxy -- or ideology, if you will. Although a strong free speech principle, and especially the version iconically offered by John Stuart Mill in Chapter Two of On Liberty (Mill 1859), counsels tolerance of challenges to even the most accepted ideas, the core idea of free speech itself is, as Hand observed, the one idea that seems virtually immune from challenge. Ironically, there may thus be far less free speech, especially in academic circles, but also in journalistic and arts and literary circles, about the free speech principle than that principle recommends for all or most other topics.

These abstract observations are relevant to thinking about the recent fusillade of books (Ben-Porath 2017; Chemerinsky and Gilman 2017; Fish 2014; Lukianoff 2014; Lukianoff and Haidt 2018; Post 2012; Whittington 2018) and articles (Bloom 2017; Ceci and Williams 2018) addressing the related (but not identical) ideas of academic freedom and of freedom of speech in colleges and universities. Joining that array is the book under review here, a collection of twenty-one (including the editors' substantive introduction) mostly original essays on various aspects of academic freedom and on the free speech issues now arising and widely discussed on college and university campuses.

As with almost all of the recent books and articles on the topic, the book is generally consonant with Hand's observations. Although the essays by Jason Brennan on the risks of external funding of university activities (pp. 96-114) and by Rima Najjar Kapitan on faculty governance (pp. 330-347) address questions largely orthogonal to the central freedom of speech and academic freedom issues that characterize the remainder of the book, the bulk of the essays address those issues of harmful speech, speech codes, hate speech, and freedom of academic inquiry that are not only at the center of many contemporary controversies but have also dominated free speech thinking since Mill and pervaded academic freedom thinking since at least the beginning of the twentieth century. Moreover, almost all of the essays address the issues with the point of view of the very orthodoxy that Hand identified. Depending on how one counts, between sixteen and nineteen of the twenty-one essays in the book that address core freedom of speech and academic freedom issues generally take somewhere between moderately strong and very strong positions in favor of robust free speech protection, equally robust protection of academic freedom, and considerable skepticism, if not downright hostility, to the proffered restrictions on college and university campuses that have inspired most of the current controversies.

That a collection of essays should, taken in the aggregate, have a point of view is no basis for criticism. If monographs may have and press a point of view, then there is no reason why a collection of shorter contributions may not have similar goals. Still, the lineup of contributions does cast doubt on the editors' claim to be presenting "a variety of points of view" (p. 1) and a collection of "diverse ideas" (p.1). With the few exceptions to be discussed presently, what is missing is a significant representation of the views of those who, for example, would be sympathetic to campus restrictions on "hate speech," or might believe that what some call offensive speech is in fact harmful, or maintain that claims of academic freedom are largely unjustified or overblown. Such views are of course widely present. If they were not, then many of the current issues would not have arisen in the first place. But arguments for restriction or arguments against freedom of speech or academic freedom are scarcely represented, except as caricatured foils, in the instant collection.

This book is academic in the best sense of that term in that most of the contributions are more moderated in tone than some of the polemics now appearing, are attentive to the need for references to the existing literature, and generally acknowledge the existence of opposing positions. But the collection is also academic in the sense that almost all of the authors are professional academics -- they teach and write for a living within colleges and universities, as do I. But academics writing about academic freedom occupy a special position, one not unlike the position of Texans or Saudis writing about the virtues of petroleum exploration, of French vintners touting the health benefits of red wine or of team owners in the National Football League downplaying the dangers of the sport from which they profit. In all of these cases, and so many more, we are skeptical when policy conclusions align so neatly with the self-interest of those who advance them, and so too might we be similarly skeptical of academics trumpeting the virtues of academic freedom. Implicit in any academic freedom claim is the assumption that the freedom from institutional (or political) control of the academic working in, say, a state university is greater than the equivalent freedom for an employee of the state highway department, and that this greater freedom (Schauer 2006) is greater as a matter of (desirable) legal doctrine than the freedoms that other government employees enjoy under the First Amendment or other non-governmental employees enjoy under principles of freedom of speech. And this claim of differentially strong rights and differentially greater immunity from restriction is typically -- indeed, necessarily -- justified because of the special role that academics play in the larger society (Post 2012). Now that special role may indeed exist, and indeed we may be justified in recognizing it socially and legally, but we should be properly skeptical of academics touting the special importance of academic inquiry or academic employment (Schauer 2013), a special importance that does not attach, either as a matter of political philosophy or of legal doctrine, to a vast range of other socially valuable activities, such as plumbing, bus driving, and dentistry.

The risk of such congruence between the understandable biases of the academic and the academic positions that they as academics support is worth noting in part because it exacerbates the risk, in individual contributions as well as in academic discourse about academic freedom and free speech as a whole, that contrary positions will be downplayed or ignored.[1] Thus, almost all of the contributions in this book cite and discuss Mill's On Liberty, but not a one even mentions the roughly contemporaneous book-length response to that book by James Fitzjames Stephen, no mean scholar himself. This is but one example of the way in which most of the contributors not only often fail to take seriously the strongest arguments against their own positions, but also almost completely neglect the writings of those philosophers and philosophical fellow travelers who press most vigorously and influentially against the Millian orthodoxy, including Larry Alexander (2005), Catharine MacKinnon (1993), Jeremy Waldron (2014), Rae Langton (2009), Alvin Goldman (1996), and even the free-speech-skeptical arguments in articles in journals such as Ethics and Philosophy and Public Affairs.[2] Indeed, even the generally Millian (in the broadest sense) conclusions of philosophers such as Thomas Scanlon (1972), Seana Shiffrin (2014), Judith Thomson (1990, 252-259), and Wayne Sumner (2004) make little or no appearance, leading to the conclusion that this collection would have been much improved not only had more of the contributors engaged with or at least acknowledged at least a generation of serious modern analytical philosophical thinking on free speech topics, but also had more of the authors taken more seriously the possibility that many of the proposals and movements that so annoy so many of them might have more value than they credit, or even than the proponents of the proposals are willing or able to voice. We can learn from Mill (and others) about the importance in inquiry, and we might add especially in academic inquiry at colleges and universities, of making and confronting the strongest arguments against one's own position, even if those arguments are not actually being made by opponents (or activist students). Many students, many academic administrators, and some faculty members do indeed advance untenable arguments for restrictions on speaking, teaching, and researching on university campuses, and many of the restrictions they propose are unfortunate. But unless the best arguments and most reasonable restrictions are considered, as few of these contributors do, then, with Mill, we would have reason to question the soundness of our own conclusions to the contrary.

This volume contains some valuable exceptions to much of what I have just said. Although Brian Leiter's conclusions on the importance of freedom of academic inquiry align with the general pro-academic freedom tone of the volume, the very fact that he brings Herbert Marcuse into the conversation, and sympathizes with a Marcusian view for the larger society, is a usefully counter-intuitive intervention. Andrew J. Cohen's examination of harm also winds up in more or less the same place as most of the other contributors, and would have benefited from recognizing even the congenial analyses of Alexander (1994) and Thomson (2000, pp., 209-210, 252-259), but it is still an analytically careful and appropriately cautious examination, which makes a significant contribution to the literature on the nature of speech-induced harm (Schauer 1993), on the nature of offense, and on the distinction, if any, between harm and offense. But the essay that stands out because of its departure from the book's general tenor and pervasive point of view is Sarah Conly's skeptical approach to the protection, especially in academic institutions, of false, and particularly factually false, speech. The essay's paucity of references is a concern, but the core of the argument should not be neglected, a core encapsulated by Conly's closing sentence: "Colleges and universities should, then, be a haven from nonsense" (p. 309). Conly, without embarrassment, confronts the fact that some propositions are false and that some of the speech that articulates such false propositions might indeed cause just the kinds of harms that the Mill of Chapter One of On Liberty, even if not the Mill of Chapter Two, would have been (or should have been) comfortable subjecting to the coercive power of the state. In advancing this claim, Conly implicitly challenges the very distinction between speech and non-speech conduct that likely undergirds any robust principle of free speech or freedom of academic inquiry (Schauer 2015). Even if we elide the well-rehearsed exegetical question whether the Mill of On Liberty was faithful to core utilitarian principles (whether Mill's or anyone else's), it is worth asking, as Conly implicitly does, whether a concern with harm can tolerate restrictions on harmful communicative acts as easily as most free speech proponents must necessarily maintain. If we depart from Mill and focus, with Conly, on the harms that are often the consequence of the articulation, especially the authoritative articulation, of false claims and false ideas, we are led to the kind of free speech skepticism that is largely absent not only from this volume, but from much of the contemporary anguish about allegedly and actually excessive restrictions on campus speech and academic inquiry.

The common response to this concern typically offers the insistent recourse to slippery-slope, thin-edge-of-the-wedge, who-decides?, where-do-you-draw-the-line? rhetoric, but the soundness of such arguments is far more of an empirical question than a logical one (Schauer 1985). But because the slippery slope claim, properly understood, is an empirical argument, then we should be receptive to an open-minded empirical investigation of its soundness. Most of the contributions draw heavily on an assortment of recent episodes -- the physical attack on Charles Murray at Middlebury College, for example, or the strong evidence of donor pressure on the withdrawal of the University of Illinois's offer of a tenured position to Steven Salaita -- where the restrictive behavior in question is difficult to defend and is harmful in its own way. But it would be nice to have some sense of the denominator. Even if incidents such these are not isolated events, and I do not claim that they are, are these and events like them frequent or rare compared to the number of factually false or morally troubling utterances by students and faculty that are widely tolerated? Are contemporary interventions more or less frequent than the interventions of the past, even if they have a different political valence? And if the admittedly unfortunate contemporary interventions are plainly harmful, how much plainly harmful -- to students, to university culture, and to the larger culture within which universities exist -- speech exists when official or (non-violent) social interventions are prohibited or discouraged? Without serious answers to these questions, far too much of the current debates about freedom of speech on campuses, about political correctness, and about academic freedom is likely to degenerate into the combat of dueling anecdotes. Good philosophical analysis of the principles involved is necessary to sort out the issues, but such analysis will be most useful if it leads the way to the kind of serious empirical research, more likely qualitative and historical than quantitative and statistical, that will help us to determine exactly what the problem is, whether it exists more now than it has in the past, what might be done about it, and whether what might be done will itself create more problems than it solves.


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Alexander, L. (2005). Is There a Right to Freedom of Expression? Cambridge. Cambridge University Press.

Amdur, R. (1980). Scanlon on Freedom of Expression. Philosophy & Public Affairs, 9, 287-300.

Ben-Porath, S.R. (2017). Free Speech on Campus. Philadelphia, PA: University of Pennsylvania Press.

Bloom, L. Jr. (2017). John Stuart Mill and Political Correctness. University of Louisville Law Review, 56, 1-35.

Brison, S. (1998). The Autonomy Defense of Free Speech. Ethics, 108 (1998), 312-339.

Ceci, S.J., & W.M. Williams. (2018). Who Decides What is Acceptable Speech on Campus? Why Restricting Free Speech is Not the Answer. Perspectives on Psychological Science, 13, 299-323.

Chemerinsky, E., & H. Gilman (2017). Free Speech on Campus. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.

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Lukianoff, G., & Haidt, J. (2018). The Coddling of the American Mind: How Good Intentions and Bad Ideas are Setting Up a Generation for Failure. New York: Penguin Books.

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Popper, K. (1966). The Open Society and Its Enemies. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 5th ed.

Post, R. (2012). Democracy, Expertise, and Academic Freedom. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.

Scanlon, T.M. (1972). A Theory of Freedom of Expression. Philosophy & Public Affairs, 1, 204-226.

Schauer, F. (1982). Free Speech: A Philosophical Enquiry. Cambridge. Cambridge University Press.

Schauer, F. 1985. Slippery Slopes. Harvard Law Review, 99, 361-383.

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[1] A prominent exception in this volume is Brian Leiter's interesting and valuable attempt to find compatibility between Mill and Herbert Marcuse, an attempt possibly foreshadowed by Stephen's discussion of the circumstances in which Millian assumptions of rationality might not hold, but an attempt that distinguishes the domain of academic discourse from the discursive domain of the larger society.


[2] For example, Amdur (1980); Brison (1998), Dyzenhaus (1992); McGowan (2003).