The Virtue of Aristotle's Ethics

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Paula Gottlieb, The Virtue of Aristotle's Ethics, Cambridge UP, 2009, 241pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521761765.

Reviewed by Gösta Grönroos, University of Stockholm



According to Aristotle’s ethical theory, the virtuous person exhibits the joint excellence of reason and of character. The virtuous person not only knows what the good thing to do is, she is also emotionally attached to it. In addition, these two excellences, or virtues, are intimately connected, so that the one cannot be had without the other (Nicomachean Ethics 6.13, 1144b30-2; 10.8, 1178a16-19). Unfortunately, Aristotle isn’t particularly explicit about the details of how these two virtues are mutually dependent, a fact which has sparked a vigorous debate among scholars. Some scholars stress the intellectual virtue pertaining to action, viz. practical wisdom (phronêsis), as the overarching disposition, while others emphasise the constitutive role of the habituated disposition to feel appropriately.1

In the The Virtue of Aristotle’s Ethics, Paula Gottlieb claims for virtues of character, such as courage, temperance, and justice, a place she thinks they have been unduly denied. She argues that the virtues of character have been poorly understood and that “the parts of his [ethical] theory examined here that have been maligned and neglected may be the most interesting and valuable of all” (214). Short of explicitly downplaying the importance of intellectual virtues, she claims that excellence of character is the ethically important virtue for Aristotle.

The book is divided into two parts. In the first part, comprising chapters 1-5, Gottlieb presents her own account of how Aristotle’s virtues of character should be understood. She singles out the doctrine of the mean as the key to that understanding. A virtue of character is an action-guiding disposition to hit the mean between two extreme emotions within a certain field. Courage, for instance, is the disposition to hit the mean between cowardice and rashness in the field of danger. The mean is determined not by the extremes alone, but by these in relation to the demands of the particular situation, including facts about the agent herself. She also defends Aristotle against misgivings about the virtues of character by showing these to be based on uncharitable readings, or on straightforward misinterpretations. She argues against the idea that virtues of character amount to moderation (Kant), and the suggestion that they are remedies for natural deficiencies in human nature (Philippa Foot, Christine Korsgaard). Moreover, it is through the doctrine of the mean that the contribution of the intellectual virtue of practical wisdom is best appreciated, for it takes a reasoned view of the situation to hit the mean. The doctrine of the mean also provides a criterion for distinguishing between real virtues and mere emotions or natural temperament.

In the second part, which comprises chapters 6-10, Gottlieb puts her interpretation of the virtues of character to the test by showing how it clears up a number of contentious issues in Aristotle’s ethical theory. These include the nature of moral dilemmas, virtuous motivation, how to understand the so-called practical syllogism, what the virtuous agent needs to know, and what kind of political arrangement best nurtures the development of virtuous persons. So in less than 250 pages, Gottlieb takes on an array of difficult, and much disputed, issues in the Nicomachen Ethics. It is a bold enterprise she undertakes.

Gottlieb’s relaxed and easily accessible style deserves praise. She intends the study not only for Aristotle scholars, but aims at a broader audience interested in ethical theory, particularly virtue ethics. The purpose is to show that on a sound reading of Aristotle, his account of the virtues of character makes an important contribution to the contemporary ethical debate. Thus, she lays claim both to a new, original interpretation of Aristotle’s account, and to its philosophical relevance. At its best, scholarship manages both things in a single study. Gottlieb’s study, though, is more than once marred by a too perfunctory treatment of contemporary theories. The comparisons would have required a more thorough treatment to be fruitful. Perhaps the scope of difficult issues is too wide to be manageable.

Before I turn to some of Gottlieb’s more contentious and problematic claims, I have some concerns about the general approach of the study. To begin with, the assumption seems to be that something substantial in the understanding of Aristotle’s virtues of character has been lost on the scholarly community, and that once we make up for this negligence, these virtues will appear philosophically more attractive, and some central and longstanding issues in Aristotle’s ethical theory will appear less problematic. Gottlieb’s account of the nameless virtues in chapter 2 perhaps makes up for a neglected aspect, although I will return to a point of disagreement with that account. By and large, however, it is a fairly conventional interpretation she puts forward. The claim that a virtue of character is the disposition for a state of equilibrium between two extreme emotions relative to the particular circumstances isn’t startling.2 Her repudiation of some alternative interpretations in chapters 1 and 3 is compelling, but the targets of the polemics do not represent the main stream of Aristotle scholarship.

Moreover, Gottlieb leaves untouched some of the important misgivings regarding Aristotle’s account of the virtues of character. In particular, she does not alleviate the concern that Aristotle’s account has an explanatory deficit. For even if Aristotle didn’t intend to provide us with a decision procedure, the question is what contribution the virtues of character make to the choice of the right course of action. The phenomenon to be articulated is that some people tend to have a good judgement, and to get it right even in demanding, complex situations. Learning that the virtuous person has the disposition to hit the mean between two extremes relative to the situation doesn’t advance our understanding much. Indeed, explaining what the virtues of character are, and in what way they help the agent hit the mean, by appealing to how the virtuous person would react has an air of circularity. To be fair, Gottlieb makes efforts, to which I’ll return shortly, to alleviate this concern, but not entirely successfully to my mind.

However, my main concern is Gottlieb’s characterisation of virtue of character as the ethical virtue. To begin with, Aristotle’s characterisation of the virtues of character as excellences pertaining to ethos is not telling in this regard, and Gottlieb’s gloss “ethical virtue” for virtue of character is symptomatic, but confusing, since what matters ethically is what pertains to the good, and happy, life as a whole. My concern here is not the vexed question of the place of contemplation in the happy life. For even the picture of practical wisdom remains incomplete. Far from being merely instrumental, the exercises of intellectual virtues, practical wisdom included, are just as ethically significant in their own right as the virtues of character, being part and parcel of the happy human life.

So when Gottlieb claims in chapter 7 that virtuous actions can be chosen for their own sake, and not merely for the sake of happiness, one wonders what notion of happiness she is operating with. Since they are constituents of the happy life, there is no difference between choosing virtuous actions for their own sake and choosing them for the sake of happiness. It is true that virtuous action is motivated both by the non-rational part of the soul and by the reason-possessing part. But the fact that the reason-possessing part of the virtuous person desires virtuous action because it is good, forming part of the happy life, doesn’t mean that it chooses it as a means to happiness.

I now turn to some more specific issues. In view of the rich array of intricate topics, I’ll focus on those aspects of Gottlieb’s discussion that are most pertinent to her stated aim to clarify the place of the virtues of character in Aristotle’s ethical theory.

In chapter 5, Gottlieb discusses the claim that the virtues of character form a unity such that one cannot be had without all the rest. For instance, in order to exhibit the virtue of generosity, it is not enough to give the right amount to the right person at the right time for the right reasons. The resources shared must also have been acquired in accordance with other virtues such as justice. So the fully virtuous person must integrate the different virtues into a whole. Equipped with this disposition, the agent can assess the particular situation against the demands of the different virtues so as to form a balanced decision what to do. In addition to the role played by practical wisdom in deliberating to such decisions, Gottlieb pinpoints its role in the genetic process of turning the natural temperaments into fully blown prohairetic virtues, i.e., reason-informed dispositions for action. It is in this reasoning process that the different virtues are integrated into a unity.

I sympathise with this suggestion as far as the development of the virtuous character goes. But does it have any immediate bearing on the claim that having one virtue of character requires having all the rest? We are left guessing how turning even one natural temperament into a virtue of character requires the rest of them. The issue, it should be pointed out, is not the requirement on the practically wise person to have all the virtues of character integrated into a harmonious whole — a fairly trivial point at that. Instead, the claim at issue is that a person cannot develop, and possess, a single virtue of character without developing all of them. What is needed is an account of what the alleged mutual dependence of all the virtues of character really amounts to. For instance, even if it seems reasonable to say that on some occasions the response of the virtue of courage must be checked against the demands of the virtue of temperance, why should possession of courage require possession of all other virtues of character? What adds to the problem is that it isn’t even clear what kind of considerations the requirement is rooted in. Is it a claim about how psychological faculties work, or a conceptual claim, or a claim about the ethical reality such that all the virtues of character have a bearing on each and every action?

Even if the virtuous person has integrated all virtues of character into a harmonious whole, mightn’t the demands of different virtues at times be irreconcilable? In chapter 6, Gottlieb argues that on Aristotle’s account moral dilemmas do not challenge the excellent person’s virtue. Forced to choose between two repugnant alternatives, choosing the less bad action does not jeopardise the character of the agent, although she might still feel regret for the action. The suggestion is sound as far as it goes. But Gottlieb then goes on to undermine the problem at hand. For according to her, “Aristotelian practical reasoning is more complicated than the version of single competing options given by those who propose the modern analysis of modern dilemmas” (129). The idea is that the flexibility provided by the fact that the mean is relative to the particular circumstances makes the dilemma conception of moral challenges simple-minded. When the total situation is appreciated, more than the two repugnant alternatives of the dilemma will emerge.

Here I wonder what Gottlieb’s target, “the modern analysis of modern dilemmas”, is. It cannot be the metaethical interest in moral dilemmas, the purpose of which is to investigate the theoretical framework of moral philosophy. Is it the assumption that there are real life moral dilemmas? It is of course true that when a moral dilemma is insufficiently specified, one might wonder whether there is a way of disarming the dilemma by considering the situation more carefully. But are there any reasons to believe this always to be the case?

In chapter 8, Gottlieb makes her main effort to clarify the intimate connection between the virtues of character and practical wisdom. This effort involves her in a revisionist, and unorthodox, account of the practical syllogism in Aristotle. The idea is that the first part in both the major and the minor premises refers to the character of the agent, and that it plays an explanatory role similar to that of the middle term in a scientific syllogism. Gottlieb conceives of the practical syllogism not merely as an explanatory schema, but takes it to express a mental act on the part of the agent. She gives the following example (165):

Temperate human beings should avoid sweets.

I’m a temperate human being and this is sweet.

I should avoid this.

So the virtue of temperance is supposed to explain the outcome, which is the act of avoiding the sweet. (For the present purposes, I’ll ignore the problems involved in determining precisely what the conclusion is, and in what sense the action can be said to follow from the premises.) Gottlieb also suggests that the first part of the minor premise expresses self-knowledge, and is dependent on one of the nameless virtues of character, viz. truthfulness, which is the disposition to hit the mean between self-depreciation and boastfulness. So the claim that practical wisdom is dependent on the virtues of character is explained by this twofold dependence of the practical syllogism on the possession of virtues of character.

I find Gottlieb’s suggestion highly implausible and even obscure. To begin with, on her account the practical syllogism is not a general schema for explaining actions, but is confined to virtuous actions exclusively. Furthermore, if the first term in the premises gives the reason for the action, then the reason to avoid sweets is the concern to be temperate, rather than the concern for health. So the principle to avoid sweets wouldn’t even hold for those who aren’t temperate. The weak-willed person, for instance, would have no reason to abide by the command of the major premise. It is obscure what weakness of will would amount to on this construal of the practical syllogism.

Moreover, the exegetic support for her construal is weak. The appeal to the De anima 434a16-21 is questionable. Even if the major premise says that such and such a person should do such and such a thing, and the minor premise says that I’m such kind of person and that this particular action is of that kind, there is nothing in the context to suggest that Aristotle has in mind character traits, rather than other traits, such as physical or cognitive capacities and their limitations, pertaining to the situation. I also doubt Gottlieb’s understanding of the role of the nameless virtue of truthfulness. For on her reading, what contributes to the practical syllogism is one of the conditions for the ethical virtue of being sincere about one’s abilities, viz., that one know one’s own abilities in the first place. That, however, seems to be a cognitive disposition.

Therefore, I agree with Anscombe’s orthodox view that the practical syllogism is not an ethical topic in its own right. The virtues of character do not, at least not generally, have an impact on the content of the syllogisms, although they have an important role in explaining whether or not the action results.

I should stress that I question neither the importance of the virtues of character, nor the intimate relationship between them and the intellectual virtue of practical wisdom. Nevertheless I find Gottlieb’s attempt to clarify what that relationship amounts to in more detail unsuccessful. By and large, she assigns to practical wisdom the instrumental role of weighing the demands of the different virtues of character in relation to the particular situation. In view of my general concern about Gottlieb’s account of the virtues of character, however, there is no need for this construal in order to show in what way practical wisdom is dependent on them. For practical wisdom has an end, viz., the good life, and the exercise of virtues of character are constitutive of that end. Now, this feature certainly complicates the relation between the virtues of character and the intellectual virtues, most notably practical wisdom, but this complication should be addressed, not circumvented.

In the end, Gottlieb’s attempt to articulate the role and the significance of the virtues of character in Aristotle’s ethical theory doesn’t advance our understanding particularly much. The compelling aspects of her account aren’t original, and those that are original don’t compel. In view of the fact that the ten chapters don’t form a tightly knit argument, one might question whether they have the makings of a monograph. Four of the ten chapters (2, 3, 5 and 8) derive from previously published articles, but not much is gained by bringing them together with one another and the rest of the chapters. Perhaps it would have been more prudent to go for separate publication of some of the new material, particularly chapters 6 and 10.

1 For the former view, see, e.g., T. H. Irwin, “Aristotle on Reason, Desire, and Virtue”, The Journal of Philosophy, 72 (1975), 567-578, and J. M. Cooper, “Some Remarks on Aristotle’s Moral Psychology”, The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 27, Supplement (1988), 25-42. For the latter view, see, e.g., D. Wiggins, “Deliberation and Practical Reason”, in A. O. Rorty (ed.), Essays on Aristotle’s Ethics (Berkeley, 1980), 221-240, and J. McDowell, “Deliberation and Moral Development in Aristotle’s Ethics”, in S. Engstrom & J. Whiting (eds.), Aristotle, Kant, and the Stoics — Rethinking Happiness and Duty (Cambridge, 1996), 19-35.

2 Cf., e.g., the thoughtful account in S. Broadie, Ethics with Aristotle (Oxford, 1991), 95-103, which covers much of the same ground.