The Virtues of Mendacity: On Lying in Politics

Placeholder book cover

Martin Jay, The Virtues of Mendacity: On Lying in Politics, University of Virginia Press, 2012, 241pp., $18.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780813932460.

Reviewed by Thomas L. Carson, Loyola University Chicago


The author of this book is a prominent intellectual historian. The book is primarily expository and historical. Jay does not provide a detailed defense of his own views, though he offers many brief comments and criticisms concerning the views he discusses.

The book's first part is a very broad survey of views about lying in the western intellectual tradition. This section is extremely informative for those interested in conceptual and moral questions about lying and deception. A very large number of authors and views are presented and discussed. Jay explains Hitler's idea from Mein Kampf that often "big lies" are less likely to be detected (and, therefore, more likely to succeed) than "small lies." Though Hitler and other Nazi leaders told many big lies, Hitler doesn't explicitly endorse telling big lies in Mein Kampf; indeed, he accuses the Jews of doing this. Jay provides an interesting discussion of the views of Machiavelli, Montaigne, Grotius, Pufendorf, and the early utilitarian philosophers Helvitius and Mercier. Analytic philosophers who read this book may be surprised to learn the how much work has been done on these topics in recent continental philosophy. For example, Derrida holds that, at least ordinarily, the conventions of language are such that speaking involves the performative act of promising that what one says is true and, that without this convention/expectation, it would be impossible to lie. On Derrida's view, lying involves the violation of this promise and a betrayal of trust. Habermas endorses a very similar view about the nature of lying. Derrida's position resembles certain views about the concept of lying defended by analytic philosophers.[1]

Jay says that conventions about the promise/expectation of truthfulness vary from context to context: "the normative expectation of truth-telling is itself conventionally variable -- we don't expect it, for example, of our enemies in war or of someone trying to sell us a used car -- but in the vast majority of situations it trumps its opposite" (p. 42).

People who are completely frank and candid often say things that are very hurtful to others. Jay frames these as cases in which moral principles requiring politeness and civility conflict with principles that require honesty. But this is oversimplified. Honesty, at least in the negative sense of refraining from lying and deception, is compatible with keeping silent and not expressing every hurtful thought or opinion one has. Honesty in this sense does not require brutal candor. Thus, it is misleading for Jay to oppose truthfulness with lying (p. 41); keeping silent and saying nothing is a distinct alternative to both lying and telling the truth. In this connection, we need to ask whether the view that there is an implicit promise to speak truthfully should be understood as the view that there is a promise to truthfully reveal information or as the view that there is a promise to refrain from saying things that one knows or believes to be false. (W. D. Ross explicitly rejects the former view and endorses the latter.)

Jay holds that there are two general views about the morality of lying:

Two general camps, have been perennially opposed: rigorous absolutists or deontologists, who denounce lying in itself as an intrinsic evil to be avoided at all costs, and consequentialists or contextualists, who are concerned with the practical impact of lying, whether or good or bad (p. 48).

Jay doesn't explain what he means by contextualism, nor does he make clear whether he thinks that one could be a contextualist without being a consequentialitst (or a consequentialist without being contextualist). He says that utilitarianism (of the sort defended by Bentham, James Mill, John Stuart Mill, and Sidgwick) is one particular form of consequentialism, but he doesn't explain his distinction between utilitarianism and consequentialism.

In addition to being unclear, this classification overlooks other important views about the morality of lying, most notably the view of Ross, who Jay does not discuss. Ross rejects both absolutism and consequentialism/utilitarianism; he holds that lying is wrong, other things equal. He says that lying is wrong unless the duty not to lie conflicts with other duties of equal or greater importance. Unlike absolutists, Ross is "concerned with" the good and bad consequences of lying, but unlike utilitarians/consequentialitsts, Ross doesn't say that consequences are the only things that are relevant to the morality of lying. It is noteworthy that the two most important rule-utilitarian/rule-consequentialist philosophers, Richard Brandt and Brad Hooker, both endorse Ross's views about the morality of lying and promise-keeping. Jay doesn't discuss rule-utilitarianism/rule-consequentialism.

Jay endorses an unfair criticism of utilitarian proposed by Rousseau. Rousseau writes:

If the obligation to tell the truth is founded only on its usefulness, how will I make myself the judge of this usefulness? Very often, what is to one person's advantage is to another's prejudice; private interest is almost always opposed to public interest (p. 61).

Jay comments:

This qualm is, of course, what always bedevils utilitarian or consequentialist arguments. Whose usefulness is the criterion? (p. 61)

But there is no serious quandary about this. All standard versions of utilitarianism/consequentialism say that every person's interests count and count equally. There are, as Jay goes on to note, serious problems about defining the standard of utility/usefulness/welfare/happiness and measuring and comparing the welfare of different individuals. But those are different problems.

The second part of the book is a survey of work in the continental tradition on the concept of "the political" which originates in Carl Schmitt's claim that "the political" constitutes a realm "distinct from mere politics and irreducible to other spheres of human endeavor" (p. 77). This part of the book is unclear and difficult to follow. Jay doesn't do nearly enough to elucidate the extremely murky and pedantic literature he discusses. The following passages give a sense of this part of the book:

As . . . Chantal Mouffe, puts it, "If we wanted to express such a distinction in a philosophical way, we could, borrowing from the vocabulary of Heidegger, say that politics refers to the 'ontic' level while 'the political' has to do with the 'ontological' one. This means that the ontic has to do with the manifold practices of conventional politics, while the ontological concerns the way in which society is instituted" (p. 79).

This aesthetic regime of politics," Ranciere adds "is strictly identical with the regime of democracy, the regime based on the assembly of artisans, inviolable written laws, and the theater as institution. Plato contrasts a third, good form of art with writing and theater, the choreographic form of the community that sings and dances its own proper unity (p. 111).

Jay is much too tolerant of the obscurantist prose of the authors in question. Many of the views discussed in the book are stated at such a high level of generality and abstraction that it is very difficult to know how to assess them.

The third and final part of the book surveys views about lying in politics with emphasis on Plato, Leo Strauss, and recent work in continental philosophy. No actual cases of lying in politics are discussed in much detail. The following passage illustrates this:

As for governmental lying to a domestic audience in order to bring about a detailed change of foreign policy, credibility gaps can widen to the point that basic confidence in leadership is eroded. But the price is much lower when the outcome is favorable -- think for example of Franklin Roosevelt's duplicity in getting America into World War II -- than when it is not, as Lyndon Johnson discovered in Vietnam, Ronald Reagan during the Iran-Contra scandal, and George W. Bush in the case of Iraq (p. 142).

Jay fails to explain why these are cases of lying and dishonesty. He shouldn't ask the reader to accept this as common knowledge. (That said, he does make a fair point about how leaders who lie often lose the trust of the public.) Readers who hope to find detailed and insightful analyses of particular examples of lying in politics will be disappointed by this book.

Some think that "the political" is a realm in which lying and cheating are routine and accepted. But Jay thinks that this view is incoherent since lying requires that one violate norms requiring that one speak truthfully. It seems likely that conventional norms and expectations about honesty and truthfulness in the political sphere vary from society to society. Jay agrees; he says that American culture is particularly opposed to Machiavellian duplicity (pp. 6-7; also see p. 42). This is insightful, but Jay could have done more with this point and looked for empirical findings in social sciences that address local norms and expectations about truth telling.

Jay's discussion of "the political" sheds very little light on the issue of lying in politics. To that extent, the book doesn't hang together well. The first and third parts of the book succeed as works of intellectual history. Those interested in the topic of lying will find a wealth of information and references in this book. The breadth of Jay's book works against the depth of his discussion and analysis, though he makes interesting use of the idea that lying involves violating an implicit promise that one is telling the truth.

[1] See W. D. Ross, The Right and the Good (Oxford University Press, 1930) and my book  Lying and Deception: Theory and Practice (Oxford University Press, 2010).