The Voices of Wittgenstein: The Vienna Circle: Ludwig Wittgenstein and Friedrich Waismann

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Baker, Gordon (ed.), The Voices of Wittgenstein: The Vienna Circle: Ludwig Wittgenstein and Friedrich Waismann, trans. Gordon Baker, Michael Mackert, John Connolly and Vasilis Politis, Routledge, 2003, 608pp, $129.95 (hbk.), ISBN 0415056446

Reviewed by Marie McGinn, University of York


This volume brings together, both in German and in English translation, material dating from 1928-1939 that was found among the papers of Friedrich Waismann after his death. The material relates to the period in which Waismann was working on a book, Logik, Sprache, Philosophie, intended to provide a systematic presentation of Wittgenstein’s ideas. An English translation of the final text was published posthumously, as The Principles of Linguistic Philosophy, in 1965. A small quantity of the material, ’Dictation for Schlick’ (40 pages of text out of a total of over 200 pages), was dictated to Waismann by Wittgenstein. The remainder is draft material for Waismann’s book and ’authorship is therefore appropriately ascribed to Waismann’ (Introduction, p.xvii). Gordon Baker defends the appearance of Wittgenstein’s name in the title of the volume on the grounds that this draft material was prepared at a time when Waismann was in regular verbal communication with Wittgenstein, and he claims that ’we can hear [Wittgenstein’s] voice throughout these texts’ (Introduction, p.xxxiii).

The original aim of Waismann’s projected book was to make the ideas of the Tractatus available to a wider audience. However, by the time Waismann began the project, Wittgenstein was already engaged in the task of freeing himself from what he now saw as the primitive conception of language that had dominated his early thought. At the same time, the focus of his investigation had widened from the relatively narrow concerns of his early work, and he was struggling to find new ways to ’illuminate the unsurveyable seething totality of our language’ (’Dictation for Schlick’, p.67). His idea had rapidly developed to a point where he found the idea of a new presentation of the thoughts expressed in the Tractatus intolerable, and he suggested that he collaborate with Waismann in a presentation of his latest ideas. The plan was for Wittgenstein and Waismann to co-author a work that would not merely be a book about Wittgenstein’s philosophy, but would be an authoritative presentation of it in his own words.

This collaborative phase of the project lasted for two years. However, it is clear that work on the project never ran smoothly. The difficulty was not merely that Wittgenstein’s thought was in a state of flux, but that his way of working was completely unsuited to a systematic presentation of his thoughts. Waismann complains, ’how difficult collaborative work with him is, since he is always following up the inspiration of the moment and demolishing what he has previously sketched out’ (Introduction, p.xxvii). And still more despairingly: ’But all one sees is that the structure is being demolished bit by bit and that everything is gradually taking on an entirely different appearance, so that one almost gets the feeling that it doesn’t matter at all how the thoughts are put together since in the end nothing is left as it was’ (Introduction, p.xxvii). Waismann eventually conceded that the whole scheme was unworkable, and he and Schlick persuaded Wittgenstein to abandon the idea of co-authorship and authorize the two of them to write the text. After Schlick’s murder in June 1936, Waismann felt he owed it to his former mentor to see the project through to completion, although it seems clear that Wittgenstein became increasingly hostile to Waismann’s use of his ideas. The hostility is not altogether impossible to understand. The thoughts that Wittgenstein expresses in ’Dictation for Schlick’ are ones that form the basis of many of the themes of the Philosophical Investigations, and it must have been extremely difficult to watch someone else give a presentation of them in which they can still be recognized but in which they have also been completely transformed. Gordon Baker concedes that Waismann is almost certainly one of the people Wittgenstein has in mind when he speaks, in the Preface to the Investigations, of his ideas being ’variously misunderstood, more or less mangled or watered down’. In the circumstances, it may seem an act of exceptional generosity on Baker’s part – prompted in part, perhaps, by the poignant story of Waismann’s life – to suggest that we hear Wittgenstein’s voice in Waismann’s text.

Indeed, one of the lessons of the material collected in this volume is the striking contrast between the style of the notes dictated by Wittgenstein and the notes that are written by Waismann himself. Looking only at the opening page of each set of notes, the contrast is clear. Wittgenstein begins his notes, characteristically, with a series of five questions. He goes on to offer what appears to be an answer to one of them, only to qualify it with a thought that begins, ’On the other hand, …’. He prefaces the thought that ’to understand a word means to know how to use it’ with the qualifying phrase, ’One could say, …’. And so on. The style is already well on the way to becoming the tentative, questioning, qualified, exploratory style of the Philosophical Investigations. By contrast, Waismann’s rendering of Wittgenstein’s thoughts on a name and its bearer, at the opening of ’Notebook 1’, has an air of laying down the law. It not only makes almost continuous use of outright assertion, but it employs the apparatus of deduction and argument: ’Hence, …’, ’Then it is clear, …’, ’Accordingly, …’, and so on. In moving from the first set of notes to the second, one has a sense of passing from notes that capture something of the living process and movement of Wittgenstein’s thought, and which have his characteristic power to engage the reader, to notes that have transformed his thought into something that is doctrinal and dogmatic and which has an air of philosophical complacency.

It is clear, moreover, that the issue is much deeper than mere style of expression. Waismann’s more doctrinal style goes along with what one can’t help feel is a failure to recognize what is most important in Wittgenstein’s new approach to his philosophical task, namely its attempt to range over the ’unsurveyable seething totality of our language’, by means of comparisons, juxtapositions and contrasts. Waismann’s text is more inclined to focus on general themes in Wittgenstein’s thought and to express them in a way that suggests that there is something more akin to a conventional philosophy of language lying at the heart of Wittgenstein’s philosophy. This is nowhere more evident than in the contrast in the use that Wittgenstein and Waismann make of the concept of grammar. In the ’Dictation for Schlick’, Wittgenstein has already begun to develop his method of grammatical investigation. He makes comparisons between the grammar of different concepts: understanding and a conscious state, understanding and thinking, thinking and expecting, expecting and imagining, and so on. The remarks on grammar that form the context for these enquiries form a relatively small part of the text and are largely directed at clearing up misconceptions – e.g. that grammar is answerable to, or justified by, the nature of reality – or to clarifying what it means to say, e.g., that something cannot be red and green. Nowhere in these notes is there a sense that Wittgenstein is offering a theory of grammar, or a theory of how language functions.

Waismann, by contrast, is concerned above all to establish, on the one hand, what grammar is, and on the other, its role in the removal of philosophical confusion. Grammar is a determination of the rules for the use of signs that is made prior to the application of language; it is established before we use language to say things. Grammar determines the internal relations between signs; it states which propositions follow from which. Internal relations are fixed by arbitrary determinations; grammar is stipulated. Philosophical confusion is confusion about the rules of language and it is removed by establishing the rules for the use of signs. If Wittgenstein’s voice is heard in these views, it is muffled and distorted, or as he himself said, it is ’more or less mangled or watered down’. One gets no sense of Wittgenstein’s method of grammatical investigation, but is rather presented with a view that is clear and pat and suggests that the process of philosophical clarification is a simple matter of appeal to agreed rules. Waismann’s rendering of Wittgenstein’s ideas is a demonstration of the danger attending the exposition of his thought, and it is one to which all commentators are subject. As a guide to Wittgenstein’s thinking at the time, Waismann’s notes – ’Dictation for Schlick’ aside - are clearly problematic; much more problematic than his record of the conversations between Wittgenstein and members of the Vienna Circle in 1929 and 1930, published as Wittgenstein and the Vienna Circle. This is no doubt why even the editor is led to make only a very modest claim for them: ’[We have] a corpus of texts many parts of which must have originated in [Wittgenstein’s] words and been vetted at some stage by Wittgenstein himself. Not everything translated here may be pure gold, but there are surely substantial nuggets to be found within it’ (Preface, p.xli). Hmmm. Possibly.