The Wave Function: Essays on the Metaphysics of Quantum Mechanics

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Alyssa Ney and David Z. Albert (eds.), The Wave Function: Essays on the Metaphysics of Quantum Mechanics, Oxford University Press, 2013, 229pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199790548.

Reviewed by Jeffrey A. Barrett, University of California, Irvine


This is an uncommonly good collection of essays on the metaphysical foundations of quantum mechanics. It contains work on a compelling subject from a number of the most engaging philosophers of physics, and the overall standard of clarity is exceptional. Beginning with a fifty-page introduction to the topic by co-editor Alyssa Ney, this is an anthology that serves well both working philosophers of physics and students of the subject. There is also much here for philosophers of science and metaphysicians, more generally.

In addition to a short preface by the editors and Ney's introductory essay, the anthology contains ten newly commissioned essays by David Albert, Valia Allori, Steven French, Sheldon Goldstein and Nino Zanghi, Peter Lewis, Tim Maudlin, Bradley Monton, Alyssa Ney, Jill North, and David Wallace. The idea behind the commission was to address the question of "what kinds of things wave functions are." While each of the essays address this issue in one way or another, the philosophical scope of the collection is significantly broader than the charge to the authors might suggest. The essays are written in a way that does not presuppose a specialized mathematical or physical background in order to be accessible to philosophers.

The main philosophical theme concerns what quantum mechanics might be understood to be about such that it might be taken to provide a satisfactory account of our ordinary experience. More specifically, the essays concern the role of metaphysical commitments in providing a satisfactory account of experience in the context of the currently most promising formulations of quantum mechanics, formulations that seek to address the quantum measurement problem.

In order to get an idea of what is involved here, one might think of a resolution of the quantum measurement problem as involving two steps. First we want a theory that can provide a complete and consistent physical description of the quantum world; then we want an account of our ordinary experience in terms of the description provided by that theory.

While the first step is arguably accomplished by formulations of quantum mechanics like Bohmian mechanics, GRW, and Everett's pure wave mechanics, accounting for ordinary experience in such theories is significantly more difficult than accounting for our experience in classical mechanics. There are two related reasons for this.

First, in order to provide a compelling explanation of an observer's experience, we need something in the description of the world provided by the theory on which the observer's determinate measurement records might supervene, something that we might then argue explains why we see what we do. In quantum mechanics, however, it is typically unclear how to set up an appropriate supervenience relation. This is in part because, as a consequence of the Kochen-Specker theorem, a logically consistent formulation of quantum mechanics that makes the right empirical predictions can only make determinate a relatively impoverished collection of classical properties. It might, like Bohmian mechanics, tell us that particle position is the only determinate observable classical quantity or, like GRW, that approximate particle position is the only determinate quantity and that it is only determinate under special conditions or, like Everett's pure wave mechanics, that there is a sense in which there are typically no determinate classical quantities whatsoever. And the upshot is that we are not left with much to work with in devising a supervenience relation that provides a compelling account of our ordinary experience of classical-seeming objects.

Second, and closely related, there is a sense in which quantum mechanics describes the state of the physical world not in terms of objects and events in the 3-dimensional space of ordinary experience, but in terms of objects and events in a high-dimensional configuration space. As an example, a Bohmian might, as the physicist John Bell once suggested, think of Bohmian mechanics as describing a wave function that lives in 3N-dimensional configuration space, where N is the total number of particles in the universe, and pushes around in this space the joint configuration of N the particles. We then have the task of accounting for our experience of objects that seem always to have a rich set of determinate classical properties and seem to inhabit ordinary 3-dimensional space using the theory's impoverished and counterintuitive description of the physical world.

Negotiating the gulf between ordinary experience and how a particular formulation of quantum mechanics describes the physical world involves showing that we can provide a satisfactory account of experience from the theory together with a plausible collection of metaphysical commitments. But how satisfactory the account is judged to be will depend on what we require from a satisfactory explanation of experience and on how plausible we judge the metaphysical commitments employed in the explanation.

Those with strong views concerning what metaphysical commitments we ought to make in order to provide a satisfactory account of experience in the context of quantum mechanics form two roughly individuated clans. A member of the metaphysics-from-theory clan takes whatever her favorite formulation of quantum mechanics seems to talk about most directly (e.g., particles with a determinate joint configuration and the wave function evolving in 3N-dimensional configuration space) as fundamental, then seeks to explain how the objects of everyday experience might be accounted for in terms of such a theory-given metaphysics. In contrast, a member of the primitive-ontology clan seeks to identify a generic metaphysics that quantum mechanics and other physical theories might be taken to be about such that they would provide a satisfactory account of ordinary experience, then translates the quantum theory into something that talks about that generic metaphysics.

Both clans take the question of the proper quantum metaphysics to be relatively straightforward when properly understood. The metaphysics-from-theory clan, as illustrated in the context of different formulations of quantum mechanics in the approaches of people like David Albert and David Wallace, takes its favored formulation of quantum mechanics, whatever that may be, to tell us directly what there is in the physical world and what it does. And the primitive-ontology clan, as Valia Allori characterizes her colleagues, holds that "all fundamental physical theories" share a set of common features. Salient among these is that they are all, properly conceived, ultimately about "entities living in three-dimensional space or in space-time" whose "histories through time provide a picture of the world according to the theory" (60).

There are, however, good reasons to deny that we are in possession of anything like a canonical quantum metaphysics. And, given the explanatory trade-offs involved, perhaps we should not even want one.

To begin, alternative formulations of quantum mechanics typically suggest quite different metaphysical commitments, and it remains entirely unclear what formulation of quantum mechanics, or even general approach to addressing the quantum measurement problem, we should adopt. An Everettian may favor understanding physical objects as manifestations of patterns in the wave function, as there is a sense in which that is all the theory talks about. A Bohmian, in contrast, need not appeal to patterns in the wave function to get particles as emergent entities, since the theory itself can be naturally taken to talk about particles directly. And a GRWian may take her theory to talk about particles, but particles of a quite different nature than those of the Bohmian. Consequently, without a canonical approach to resolving the measurement problem, there can be no canonical sense of proper metaphysical commitment.

Even after choosing a preferred formulation of quantum mechanics, however, there is a significant degree of interpretational freedom that we might take to be in service of the type of explanation we want. A metaphysics-from-theory Bohmian might take the wave function properly understood to describe an entity that lives in a high-dimensional configuration space, while a primitive-ontology Bohmian might insist that, properly understood, the wave function is not a real physical entity and that configuration space is just abstract mathematical convenience. A natural question here is, Properly understood for what purpose? It is likely that both clans would answer for the purpose of providing a satisfactory account of experience. But if so, this suggests that there is in fact no shared sense of what should count as a satisfactory explanation of ordinary experience and, hence, that there is no canonical metaphysics that answers to what people think ought to count as a satisfactory explanation

Primitive ontologists seek to paper over the apparent metaphysical differences between alternative formulations of quantum mechanics and the counterintuitive metaphysical commitments suggested by the reliance on representational artifacts like a high-dimensional configuration space.  They do this by insisting that all satisfactory formulations of quantum mechanics are in fact ultimately about our experience. This requires that, regardless of what they may seem to be about, all formulations of quantum mechanics -- indeed all fundamental physical theories whatsoever -- are in fact about a primitive ontology consisting of entities with ordinary histories in ordinary 3-dimensional space. We may ultimately want to account for the experiential intuitions of the primitive ontologist by showing how our best physical theories might, at some level of description, allow us to talk of ordinary objects with ordinary spatial relations. But simply to stipulate that a theory's most basic description of the world must be in terms of such entities in order to provide a satisfactory account of ordinary experience clearly begs the explanatory and metaphysical questions at hand.

Of course, the metaphysics-from-theory Bohmian is no closer than the primitive ontologist Bohmian in providing a canonical metaphysics. In part this is because, even if you are a committed metaphysics-from-theory Bohmian, there are alternative Bohmian formulations of quantum mechanics that suggest quite different ontological commitments. You might, for example, opt for a formulation of Bohmian mechanics where local field values, rather than particle configurations, are determinate. Keeping such an option open is a methodological virtue insofar as there may well be physical phenomena better characterized and explained in terms of fields than in terms of particles. And, of course, there is nothing incoherent in supposing that our determinate mental records of our ordinary experiences supervene on local field values rather than particle positions. Indeed, it could even turn out that such a supervenience relation would be found to have explanatory advantages when we learn better how physical brain states represent cognitive states.

The thought is that there are explanatory tradeoffs between alternative explanations of ordinary experience and no matter of fact concerning which explanatory virtues are most significant. We may insist that quantum mechanics is ultimately just about the commonsense objects of experience, like honeydew melons and pianos in ordinary 3-dimensional space. Then our account of experience will be more direct and sure than if we postulate the existence of an entity corresponding to the wave function and the joint particle configuration in 3N-dimensional configuration space (or as the Everettian would have it, just the wave function), and then aim to get the ordinary 3-dimensional objects of experience as emergent entities. But it is also thinner and feels more ad hoc given the way that quantum mechanics seems to describe the world.

There is something methodologically satisfying in getting an account of experience from surprisingly weak metaphysical commitments or in getting a surprising account of ordinary experience from the strongly counterintuitive metaphysical commitments suggested by a particular theory, or both. Getting a rich account of ourselves as observers and of our ordinary experience of 3-dimensional objects from patterns in the wave function in the context of pure wave mechanics, or even from the wave function and the evolution of the particle configuration in a high-dimensional space in Bohmian mechanics, would be an explanatory triumph. But one should also expect disagreement regarding whether the explanation of experience one thus provides is entirely successful. My own sense is that, largely because of the difficulty in providing a rich account of quantum probability in the context of pure wave mechanics, the metaphysics-from-theory GRWians and Bohmians fare better in providing such an account than their Everettian colleagues. We might say that in starting with less, the metaphysics-from-theory Everettian project is the more heroic. But that also means that Everrettians may ask us to sacrifice more of what we might reasonably want in an explanation of ordinary experience.

The question of how a physical theory should tie to ordinary experience is an old one. Insofar as empirical adequacy is taken to be a primary virtue for physical theories, the question will continue to be salient, but quantum mechanics makes it especially so. It requires that we reconsider the question of what a satisfactory account of experience should look like. This anthology is an excellent introduction to why and how.