The Work of Giorgio Agamben: Law, Literature, Life

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Justin Clemens, Nicholas Heron, and Alex Murray (eds.), The Work of Giorgio Agamben: Law, Literature, Life, University of Edinburgh Press, 2011, 214pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780748643653.

Reviewed by Alessia Ricciardi, Northwestern University


The Work of Giorgio Agamben: Law, Literature, Life is one of the most recent examinations in the Anglophone world of the philosopher's controversial thought. The essays brought together by Clemens et al. follow in the wake of an earlier collection, Giorgio Agamben: Sovereignty and Life, edited by Matthew Calarco and Steven DeCaroli and published by Stanford in 2007, which mounted a sustained critical confrontation with Agamben's most discussed notions and positions. Calarco and DeCaroli's anthology offered readers a relentless questioning of Agamben's texts by the likes of Ernesto Laclau, William Connolly, Antonio Negri, Dominick LaCapra, and Paul Patton. If "siting Agamben," to borrow LaCapra's expression, was the task of the earlier volume, the more recent sampling of scholarly encounters with the Italian thinker's ideas appears to have a celebratory purpose, which unfortunately results at a number of points in somewhat tedious and self-indulgent recitations of his conundrums. However, the better efforts in The Work of Giorgio Agamben, although tending to be inelegantly composed, at least generally possess the raw energy of very good doctoral work.

At times, especially in the anthology's final section, the contributors undertake to reapply Agamben's concepts -- most particularly that of gesture -- in the fields of dance, cinema, and media. In so doing, they tantalizingly promise to extend his methods of analysis to new areas of inquiry. Barbara Formis takes on something of this project in "Dismantling Theatricality: Aesthetics of Bare Life." Reflecting on a 1965 choreographic work by Anne Halprin, "Parades and Changes," the author recognizes in Halprin's piece a questioning of theatrical convention that exemplifies Agamben's ideal of an aesthetics no longer coinciding with art but rather with the point of indifference between art and life. However, Formis demonstrates a penchant for circular logic in the essay, a logic that is neither mitigated nor enlivened by her habit of condensing argument to the point of incomprehensibility: "Legs are crossed, as if this position was natural, whereas it is rendered necessary by a biopolitical apparatus unconsciously rooted in our gestures and attitudes" (185).

More useful is Alex Murray's "Beyond Spectacle and the Image: the Poetics of Guy Debord and Agamben." This essay focuses on the role of the image for Debord and Agamben and their common attitude toward "poetics," understood not just as poetry but as a broader critical practice. In my opinion, Murray's argument gains its greatest urgency in a footnote in which the author, who otherwise credits Agamben with seeing Italy as "the laboratory in which this particular phase of Western capitalism has been implemented," admits that the relation of Agamben to the Italian political context is "uncertain" (177). Although readers like Murray may concern themselves chiefly with the "obscure" relationship between Agamben and some of his politically-minded peers in contemporary Italian philosophy such as Antonio Negri and Paolo Virno, I find more disquieting Agamben's near silence over the years when it comes to the political and cultural agenda of Italy's recurrent prime minister, Silvio Berlusconi. For such a harsh critic of the society of spectacle as Agamben has proven to be, his refusal of critical attention to Italy's advanced state of subjugation by the media seems like thoughtless snobbery at best.

One of the more freewheeling essays in the book is Julian Wolfreys's "Face to Face with Agamben; or, the Other in Love," which bears mentioning mostly because it emblematizes the anthology's shortcomings. Wolfreys's essay is remarkable not least for trying to make it look natural to speak of "Agamben" and "the Other" in the same sentence. Agamben is the rare philosopher who in fact never mentions the Other in his work and seems impervious to the viral influence of Levinas's use of the category in the field of ethics (or, for that matter, of Lacan's use of it in psychoanalysis). Wolfreys knows this is the case but cannot resist playing the risky game of setting out to deduce the reasons behind Agamben's "silence" or "avoidance" of the Other. What follows is an awkward and at times even goofy effort on Wolfreys's part to reintroduce the concept of the Other into Agamben's work through the topic of love. One cannot avoid recognizing that the experiment has not entirely succeeded when Wolfreys concludes that in "its loving engagement [Agamben's writing] constitutes the most sustained, transparent and yet, simultaneously, opaque of commentaries" (153).

Among the essays I would single out on more positive grounds is Anton Schütz's very solid contribution, "The Fading Memory of Homo non Sacer." Schütz ambitiously takes on the assignment of devising a philosophical genealogy to address the question, "Has there been a time before homo sacer?" His essay begins with an examination of the logic of Foucault's historicism, which in Schütz's opinion enforces the notion of a break between the premodern and modernity through what he dubs the "'there-is-always-something-that-happens-just-before-or-around-1800' stance" (115). Schütz strongly criticizes the notion that the genealogy of modernity extends back "only" 200 years, a position that he maintains Foucault assumed in opposition to the prevailing critical preference for historical continuities if not outright "transhistoric" conditions (117). (It might be replied, of course, that to ascribe such a starkly lapsarian narrative to Foucault's historicism is itself something of a caricature, as there are other epistemic breaks or watersheds that the French philosopher regards as at least as important as the year 1800.) Consequently, the author is intrigued by Agamben's renunciation of the typically Foucauldian historical timeframe, especially when it comes to biopolitics.

As is well known, biopolitics for Agamben does not wait for modernity to exert itself as the dominant paradigm. Schütz proceeds by questioning Agamben's appropriation and redefinition of Festus's notion of homo sacer, which properly belongs to the vocabulary of the early Roman tradition. At stake is the compatibility of the legal and religious meanings of the term, which the very definition of homo sacer problematizes in its emphasis on the paradoxical state of being "killed but not sacrificed." For the author, one possible way out of this impasse is, in the wake of Agamben's Profanations, to reconsider the supposed indifference of homo sacer to the opposing claims of the religious and the secular, instead of regarding the concept as corresponding to the divide between the sacred and the profane. The essay takes a deft final detour through Agamben's "anti-tragic" interpretation of Kafka's "Before the Law," concluding, perhaps unsurprisingly, that the possibility of once again becoming homo non sacer involves too many levels of negation to be feasible once the division between "status and life" has inscribed itself.

Other essays in the collection productively analyze the synergy between Kafka, Benjamin, and Agamben, although sometimes overstating their claims. Arne de Boever's interesting "Politics and Poetics of Divine Violence: On a Figure in Giorgio Agamben and Walter Benjamin" is quite original, if not always convincing, in proposing a meaningful parallel between Benjamin's "The Storyteller" and "Critique of Violence," on the one hand, and Agamben's Homo Sacer and The Time That Remains, on the other, as the result of both thinkers' fascination with figures of "divine violence." Alexander García Düttman's "Integral Actuality: On Giorgio Agamben's Idea of Prose" is a fine, if quite dated (original year of publication: 1995), reading of Agamben's view of the relationship between philosophy and poetry in light of the concept of prose advanced by Benjamin in his writings on history and the messianic. Rather less successfully, the three co-editors of the collection, Clemens, Heron, and Murray, deliver a preface that is short and perfunctory and bears the stupefyingly pedestrian title, "The Enigma of Giorgio Agamben." In the inaugural essay, "K," by contrast, Agamben himself plays his customary game of elaborately constructed measures (the essay is divided into several numbered shorter paragraphs and two sections) during which we learn that the letter that provides the initial of the protagonist's surname in Kafka's The Trial ("Josef K.") ultimately names the figure of the Kalumniator and allows us to understand the writer's world and strategy as comic, not tragic.

Notwithstanding the interest of the philosopher's own brief contribution to The Work of Giorgio Agamben, if one wants to read a clear and well-written introduction to his work, then a better choice would be Leland de la Durantaye's learned Giorgio Agamben: A Critical Introduction (2009) or else, for a polished, recent revisiting of several of Agamben's critical philosophical concerns, Eric Santner's scintillating The Royal Remains (2011).