Themes From Early Analytic Philosophy: Essays in Honour of Wolfgang Künne

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Benjamin Schnieder and Moritz Schulz (eds.), Themes From Early Analytic Philosophy: Essays in Honour of Wolfgang Künne, Rodopi, 2011, 400pp., $119.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789042033627.

Reviewed by James Pearson, William Jewell College


This special issue of the Grazer Philosophische Studien honoring Wolfgang Künne is comprised of fifteen new essays written by his colleagues and former students. Read as a whole, a mosaic of an influential career in the philosophy of logic and language emerges, one that has been shaped by a deep engagement with historical figures, particularly Bolzano and Frege. While this Festschrift will thus certainly interest Künne scholars, it suffers from a lack of coherence. In their brief preface, the editors praise Künne as a teacher and scholar, yet do not introduce the essays, which range dramatically in subject, scope, and quality. Some chapters offer sustained critiques of Künne's ideas, while others make only occasional reference to them. Nor is there an index. One wishes that Künne could have responded to these essays in some manner; perhaps a concluding chapter could have forged connections. Instead, the abstracts that begin each essay are the reader's sole guide. Given abstracts' predictable unreliability, I shall here say something about each of these occasionally dense works, lest some of their adept moves be missed.

Indeed, the volume's strength lies in particular essays (especially Mark Siebel's and Hans-Johann Glock's), and, although it is unsuitable as a class text, a few of the better ones could be usefully incorporated into graduate classes in early analytic philosophy or the philosophy of logic and language. For instance, Andreas Kemmerling's interpretive argument that Fregean thoughts do not consist of parts includes an appendix collating relevant evidence (in English and German) from Frege's texts, constituting an interesting and accessible case study. Also, John Hyman models the critical distance necessary to illuminate Wittgenstein's late writings to "the uninitiated," and Tobias Rosefeldt expertly deploys a lesser-known text from Frege's Posthumous Writings (a partial transcript of his dialogue with Bernhard Pünjer) to elucidate both Frege's and Kant's views on existence.

The collection is divided thematically into four sections. The first, "Truth and Assertion," begins with two papers criticizing Künne's view that, since propositions are the primary bearers of truth, the following "modest" principle captures the core applications of "true":

(MOD)∀x (x is true ↔ ∃p ((x = the proposition that p) . p))

Ian Rumfitt rejects Künne's privileging of propositions. He argues instead for two general schemata, the ellipses in which are to be replaced by specifications of the kind of truth-bearer in question:

(T) a is true if and only if for some p, a is a . . . that p, and p

(F) a is false if and only if for some p, a is a . . . that p, and it is not the case that p

Locating this proposal in the work of Frank Ramsey and Arthur Prior, Rumfitt acknowledges that, by freely employing the locution "a is a . . . that p," the Ramsey-Prior theory renders any truth-conditional account of meaning viciously circular. His intriguing solution is bilateral evidentialism, the view that a statement's content is to be defined in terms of the conditions under which it is correctly asserted and correctly denied. Rumfitt contends that Fregeans -- indeed Frege -- ought not to be hostile to combining a Ramsey-Prior theory of truth with this theory of content. He deftly argues that its bilateralism prevents truth from reducing to correct assertibility and interprets Frege's argument that truth is indefinable as an objection against any attempt to analyze truth in simpler terms (which neither Künne's modest theory nor the Ramsey-Prior theory does). Although I am unconvinced that bilateral evidentialism can be reconciled with what Frege calls the objectivity of thought, the broader semantic program suggested by Rumfitt's proposal is worth considering.

Manuel García-Carpintero's objection to (MOD) is not that it lacks generality, but that it is uninteresting. He claims that taking sayings rather than propositions to be the primary truth-bearers has two major advantages. Firstly, sayings are an illocutionary type. Employing such abstract entities that enjoy "force-like features" (53) promises (as he argues for at length elsewhere) to explain the unity of the proposition, the semantics of derogatory words, and some propositional attitude embeddings. Secondly, he claims (more contentiously and tentatively) that doing so opens the door to a correspondence theory of truth for sayings: one capable of explaining how the truth of vague sayings depends upon the truth of the plurality of propositions they signify.

Edgar Morscher argues that we ought to distinguish two conceptions of logical form in order to "repair Quine's criterion of logical truth" (81). Morscher thinks that Quine's criterion errs in taking every sentence expressed only in logical vocabulary to be either logically true or logically false. On his preferred conception, such sentences are not substitution instances of their own logical form, so defining sentences as logically true iff they instantiate some universally valid form correctly returns sentences like "∃x(x=x)" as logically indeterminate.

Siebel ends this section on a high note, elegantly critiquing Bolzano's objections to Kant's analytic/synthetic distinction. He contends that, despite misfiring, Bolzano's objections take aim at genuinely weak points. After sympathetically evaluating modifications to both Kant's distinction and Bolzano's attacks, he argues that Kant's definition of analyticity fails to capture truths, like "there is no married bachelor," that he ought to have held analytic. Kant renders this existence claim as predicating "uninstantiated" of the "concept of a married bachelor," yet this subject does not contain the predicate or a notion negating the predicate's opposite. Siebel correctly takes disagreements about the "essence" of analyticity to be fruitless -- a point he credits to Künne -- and instead exemplifies the value of taking a historical approach, exploring what distinctions in the area have been thought important for particular epistemological projects.

Glock begins the second section, "Concepts and Propositions," with a rich discussion of the proposition problem affecting (he argues) all species of cognitivism about concepts: if concepts have an ineliminable cognitive dimension, how can they be components of mind-independent propositions? Glock argues that even in Künne's neo-Fregean cognitivism, where concepts are senses of general terms, concept-possession must be explained in terms of the possessor's ability to classify and infer. After a brief and too-easily-missed digression in which he employs Wittgenstein's idea of a canonical explanation to block Jerry Fodor's objection that cognitivists cannot individuate concepts, Glock diagnoses a reifying impulse as the source of the cognitivist's difficulties. Concepts are not abilities, tools, techniques, or "objects of conceptual thought, but [rather] something involved in conceptual thought" (156). Since concepts are (perhaps indispensible) logical constructions employed to explain linguistic practices rather than genuine abstract objects, they are not components of propositions. The proposition problem dissolves.

Kemmerling argues that while Fregean thoughts do not consist of parts, they are variously decomposible. In his view, thoughts are "amorphous" in the sense that the structure a thinker finds in a thought depends upon the method used to decompose it. It would have been interesting to see how this interpretation fits with contemporary debates about the best way to understand Frege's Platonism. If we accept that Frege believed "methods of thought-decomposition [to be] entities as eternal or atemporal as thoughts themselves" (182), a deflationary reading of his Platonism might be more persuasive.

Unfortunately, Stephan Krämer's essay lacks the broader appeal of others in this volume. His modest goal is to fill a lacuna in Bolzano scholarship -- why does Bolzano think that we have limited knowledge of the contents of our mental acts? -- yet he gives no account of why readers without a prior interest in Bolzano ought to care about this question. Moreover, Krämer's main criticism is weak. According to him, Bolzano fails to explain the difficulty of acquiring knowledge of our mental states, and is thus vulnerable to a critic who insists that she has no such difficulty (205). But earlier he acknowledges that most of us "know from experience that conceptual analysis is hard" (198). I would say: "all of us." Why should Bolzano's defense of the "intransparency" of mental content turn upon his ability to convince the stubborn critic Krämer imagines? (Rather, wouldn't her claim render dubitable her capacity for what we call conceptual analysis?) Krämer seems to conflate a good argument with one capable of dislodging all interlocutors from opposing positions.

Nick Haverkamp's paper promises rather more than it delivers. He claims that his defense of objectualism (the view that there are only objects) will not only "identify the crucial shortcomings" of neo-Fregean attempts to express Frege's semantics and ontology (210), but will also undermine elucidatory strategies that take Frege's fundamental insights to be inexpressible. The reader waits with baited breath, only to find the crux of his argument lying in the expressible triviality (within the Begriffsschrift) of "everything is an object." Haverkamp closes by acknowledging that his discussion may not have captured what Frege meant by "object." I concur. This paper's strength lies in its criticisms of attempts to overcome the concept horse problem, rather than its contribution to Frege scholarship.

Section three, "Cognition and Volition," begins with Peter Simons' claim that we ought not to reify abstract entities on the basis of our use of auxiliary nouns and noun-phrases. They do not denote, he writes, but rather embody a variety of cognitive operations: nominative ones, such as singularization (employing "bravery is a virtue," rather than discussing the virtuousness of brave acts) and complexification (naming states of affairs); and proponing ones, such as stating, that advance (or work by seeming to advance) a proposition for consideration. It is disappointing that Simons does not argue for nominalism here. The proof of the value of his taxonomy -- for instance, must we admit that complexification is a cognitive operation on a par with abstraction? -- thus remains in other puddings.

Kevin Mulligan offers a dense comparison of Husserl's and Wittgenstein's accounts of the relationship between an expression's meaning and meaning something by an expression. Readers willing to plod through the long passages Mulligan extracts from not only these figures, but Reinach, Scheler, Meinon, Marty, and many others, may learn something, but more guidance from Mulligan -- who merely injects brief remarks between quotations -- would have better justified his aims in writing the chapter.

As I mentioned above, Hyman's essay on Wittgenstein's account of action and the will is a high point. It elegantly surfaces Wittgenstein's deep insights in this area: for example, how Wittgenstein uses the image of feeling a stick with a stone to transform touch into a distance sense, thereby undermining the Jamesian temptation to think of kinesthetic feelings in the fingers telling one how the world is. Beyond this interpretive work, Hyman interestingly argues that because Wittgenstein's examples all concern the movement of an agent's body, he conflates the active/passive and voluntary/non-voluntary distinctions, hence failing to distinguish action from motion. According to Hyman, the former conflation obscures voluntary passivity and non-voluntary actions, and the latter prevents Wittgenstein from recognizing that the agent, the producer of the action, is "left over" from his imagined subtraction of my arm going up from my raising my arm. Although I have misgivings about whether we can sustain the active/passive distinction if we think remaining passive is an action, Hyman's paper is stimulating and well worth reading.

In the final section, "Reference and Existence," David Wiggins defends mathematical Platonism. How can such a view explain our knowledge of abstract objects, particularly in the context of a causal theory of knowledge? Taking a cue from Peirce's idea of "secondness," Wiggins' novel proposal is that realism's attraction is the manifest "inescapability" of certain kinds of thinking, the objects of which we experience as having a "permanency" "external" to our thought. An agent who is caused to experience the secondness of sense-perception may acquire justified beliefs about the external world. An agent who becomes rationally vindicated in the secondness of mathematical entities may acquire justified beliefs about mathematics. As it stands, I find Wiggins' proposal puzzling. He thinks a mathematician is "caused" to know about mathematics, not by mathematical entities, but by her passion; truths discovered about those entities "channel" her passion, and are to be understood as "a condition under which the cause operates" (325). But these alternative descriptions do not -- at least, do not here -- amount to arguments.

By reading Pünjer as defending Kantian views, Rosefeldt persuasively explains his refusal to adopt either of the strategies Frege suggests to resolve Pünjer's contradictory conception of existence. Frege objects that were existence a property, as Pünjer claims, it would trivially apply to everything, and so could not, contra Pünjer, distinguish objects of experience from objects of hallucination. Pünjer rejects the Meinongian strategy of taking the expression "there is" to equivocate between existential commitment and neutrality and the Fregean (though not Frege's own) strategy of taking existence to concern representations rather than the objects of experience. Rosefeldt helpfully demonstrates that, by treating existence as a "merely logical" predicate -- an ascription he unpacks using Leibniz's notion of a complete individual concept -- Kant also rejected these strategies.

Robert Schwartzkopff's slightly esoteric goal is to reduce our ontological commitments by showing how the natural numbers ontologically depend upon zero. However, the arguments Schwartzkopff employs to arrive at this conclusion are surprisingly interesting -- particularly how collective predicates ("The Greeks surround Troy") require reading Hume's Principle as a first-level abstraction principle. But the question is surely whether even a single ontologically independent abstract Platonic object is too metaphysically extravagant. Schwartzkopff suggests not: the existence of each natural number depends upon properties of its predecessors (for instance, one depends upon the equinumerousity of zero with itself) and the existence of zero depends upon a corresponding fact, namely, that nothing is equinumerous with the x such that x≠x. He proposes to exempt such "factually ontologically dependent" objects from Ockham's razor, but to evaluate this proposal we would need to know more about the sort of facts that render objects eligible for this exception.

Against the backdrop of Frege's well-known views, Mark Textor closes the volume by considering how we can ensure that fictional names don't accidentally refer. After all, if a detective had actually roomed with a Dr. Watson in Baker Street, he would not be the referent of "Sherlock Holmes" in the novels of Arthur Conan Doyle. Textor rejects Lewis', Moore's, and Dummett's proposals to resolve this problem by arguing that sense-only signs have special senses incapable of referring to real objects; instead, he defends a version of the view that sense-only signs have ordinary senses, but are put forward in fictive rather than factive contexts. Textor adroitly responds to various criticisms, but many of these seem to me to misunderstand the nature of fiction, narrowly construing it as essentially narrative, modern, and realist. I suspect that the most interesting philosophical work concerning prose fiction begins with examining its pragmatic, not semantic, features.