Themes from G. E. Moore: New Essays in Epistemology and Ethics

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Susana Nuccetelli and Gary Seay (eds.), Themes from G. E. Moore: New Essays in Epistemology and Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2007, 348pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199281725.

Reviewed by William Tolhurst, Northern Illinois University


Themes from G. E. Moore is a contribution to the current re-evaluation of G. E. Moore's philosophical legacy. It comprises sixteen essays evenly divided between epistemology and ethics.

The contributors are:

Epistemological Themes

Ethical Themes

Crispin Wright

Stephen Darwall

Ernest Sosa

Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons

Ram Neta

Richard Fumerton

William G. Lycan

Charles R. Pigden

C. A. Coady

Susana Nuccetelli and Gary Seay

Paul Snowdon

Robert Shaver

Michael Huemer

Joshua Gert

Roy Sorensen

Jonathan Dancy

Among the topics discussed in the essays on epistemology are Moore's proof of the external world, anti-skeptical strategies, views on common sense, sense-data and perception, and Moore's Paradox. The topics discussed in the essays on ethics include the open question argument, non-naturalism, Moore's utilitarianism, and organic unities.

Essays on Epistemological Themes

1. Crispin Wright, 'The Perils of Dogmatism'

Crispin Wright assesses the prospects for using neo-moorean dogmatism to prove the existence of an external world. He argues convincingly that they are very dim indeed. The main problem is transmission failure. Although neo-mooreans may know that there is an external world on the basis of a Moorean argument, they lack the resources needed to show skeptics that they know this. As a result, they are unable to transmit their knowledge to the skeptic.

2. Ernest Sosa, 'Moore's Proof'

Ernest Sosa begins by noting that Moore's proof of the external world appears to have all the ingredients needed for a successful proof. He notes its similarity to a non-controversial proof that shows there is a misspelling on a piece of paper by pointing to an obvious misspelling. Since this proof seems to be a good one and Moore's is generally agreed to be a failure, we need an explanation of the difference. Sosa provides it by pointing out that the proof will only work for those who do not doubt the premises. He notes that Berkeley would be among the unconvinced.

3. Ram Neta, 'Fixing the Transmission: the New Mooreans'

Ram Neta provides additional reasons for the view that neo-mooreans cannot overcome the problem of knowledge transmission.

4. William G. Lycan, 'Moore's Anti-skeptical Strategies'

William Lycan notes that Moore deployed a number of strategies against skeptics without distinguishing them. In this essay he begins at the beginning, with Moore's first recorded response to skepticism, a reply to Hume's argument that we cannot know of the existence of an external world. Lycan then goes on to identify and assess a number of other strategies that Moore used.

5. C. A. J. Coady, 'Moore's Common Sense'

C. A. J. Coady provides a thoughtful account of Moore's views on common sense beginning with a comparison of Moore's views with those of Thomas Reid. Coady then goes on to show how Moore's greater certainty argument informs Moore's understanding of the scope of philosophy. In addition to explaining Moore's views, Coady responds to two objections to Moore's appeals to common sense, the complaints that these appeals are question begging and that they are dogmatic.

6. Paul Snowdon, 'G. E. Moore on Sense-data and Perception'

Paul Snowdon's contribution is a clear and thorough account of Moore's struggles with sense-datum theories of visual perception.

7. Michael Huemer, 'Moore's Paradox and the Norm of Belief'

Moore's Paradox is exemplified by odd statements such as 'It is raining but I don't believe it'. As Moore notes, statements such as this are defective but it is hard to pin down what is wrong with them: they are not self contradictory and could be true in some circumstances. Michael Huemer argues that reflection on the paradox is helpful in developing an analysis of the concept of knowledge and suggests an important constraint on rational belief.

8. Roy Sorensen, 'Can the Dead Speak?'

Roy Sorensen tackles this question and, in the process of arguing that the answer is no, reveals the importance of the issue by explaining its relevance to Moore's Paradox and theories of direct reference.

The essays on epistemology are well written, address important issues, and provide clear and cogent arguments for the positions defended. While there is some overlap between them, such duplication as there is is not serious and is sometimes helpful.

Essays on Ethical Themes

9. Stephen Darwall, 'How is Moorean Value Related to Reasons for Attitudes?'

Stephen Darwall focuses on the disagreement between Moore and Sidgwick concerning the fundamental concept of ethics. Moore held that it is the axiological concept of intrinsic goodness while Sidgwick took it to be the normative concept expressed by the word 'ought'. Darwall argues that Sidgwick's position is preferable because the concept of intrinsic goodness cannot provide a basis for understanding the normativity of moral attitudes.

10. Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons, 'Moorean Moral Phenomenology'

Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons argue that, despite the fact that moral phenomenology has not played much of a role in analytic moral philosophy, it is relevant to the concerns of moral philosophers. They support their claim by explaining the phenomenological significance of Moore's open question argument.

11. Richard Fumerton, 'Open Questions and the Nature of Philosophical Analysis'

Richard Fumerton notes the difficulties in figuring out just what the open question argument is and proceeds to identify five ways of construing it, none of which provide adequate support for Moore's conclusion. He then argues for the argument's importance, despite its failure, by reflecting on just where and why the argument fails. This reflection illuminates not only the argument but the nature of philosophical analysis as well. The essay concludes with the suggestion that a new form of the argument can be found in arguments for the irreducibility of normativity.

12. Charles R. Pigden, 'Desiring to Desire: Russell, Lewis, and G. E. Moore'

Charles Pigden's multifaceted essay focuses on two aims: to show that (1) Moore's arguments in defending the view that 'good' denotes a non-natural property and (2) the open question argument can both be revived in a modified form. Moore's second argument was the barren tautology argument which he derived from Sidgwick. This argument precedes the open question argument and aims to show that the identification of 'good' with a naturalistic property results in a barren tautology that cannot serve as a reason for action. Pigden explains how the argument differs from the open question argument in its ability to fend off challenges to Moore's views. In the course of achieving these objectives, Charles Pigden provides the reader with the philosophical background needed to understand the development of Moore's views and then proceeds to reveal their connections with the work of David Lewis and Saul Kripke, all the while providing clearly stated arguments as needed. His proposal for resurrecting a revised version of the open question argument will provide the reader with a good deal to think about.

13. Susana Nuccetelli and Gary Seay, 'What's Right with the Open Question Argument?'

Susana Nuccetelli and Gary Seay answer the title question by developing a version of the open question that will fend off a version of reductive naturalism and, in doing so, make room for non-naturalism. Their initial target is semantic reductive naturalism, the view that value terms can be reduced to purely descriptive terms. Their argument shows that for any putative reduction of an evaluative Term, 'E', to a descriptive term, 'D', the question, X is D, but is it E? will be an open question. This being so, the reduction fails. After responding to a great many possible objections, the authors develop and defend an argument against reductive metaphysical naturalism that is based on their argument against reductive semantic naturalism.

14. Robert Shaver, 'Non-naturalism'

Robert Shaver considers ontological and epistemological objections to non-naturalism. He responds to the ontological objection that non-naturalists are committed to an extravagant ontology of dubious entities by noting that (1) the arguments for non-naturalism do not commit non-naturalists to an extravagant ontology, (2) it is not clear that non-naturalists do have an extravagant ontology, and (3) an extravagant ontology is not required by the non-naturalist project. The epistemic objections concern self-evidence and synthetic a priori knowledge. Shaver argues that these issues are no more problematic for the non-naturalist than they are for the naturalist.

15. Joshua Gert, 'Beyond Moore's Utilitarianism'

The essay begins with a list of seven of Moore's claims about goodness. The first section assesses these claims and endorses several in modified forms. Section two argues that intrinsic value should be replaced by objective rationality as the fundamental concept of ethics. Gert explains how the isolation test can be used as an intuition pump to generate intuitions about the normative status of various choices. Section three explains how the concepts of good and bad can be understood in terms of rationality. The final section argues for the rejection of utilitarianism because it cannot provide a credible account of moral norms and rules.

16. Jonathan Dancy, 'Moore's Account of Vindictive Punishment: A Test Case for Theories of Organic Unities'

The primary focus of Jonathan Dancy's essay is a debate concerning the proper understanding of organic unities: wholes whose value exceeds the value of the sum of their parts. Section I identifies the issues and the parties to the debate. The issue concerns the proper way to understand organic unities. Variabilists, of whom Dancy is one, hold that the intrinsic values of parts can vary as the part moves from one whole to another whereas intrinsicalists, like Moore, hold that their values are invariant. Section II introduces a related issue, whether the non-intrinsic values of parts can vary as they move from one context to another. Dancy argues that they can. In Section III he argues against the widely accepted view that the intrinsic value of a thing cannot change without a change in its intrinsic properties. Section IV begins the consideration of punishment. In the remainder of the essay Dancy uses his variabilist theory of organicity to resolve some of the puzzles concerning the value of punishment.

It will come as no surprise that six of the eight essays on ethics discuss the open question argument (OQA), but it is amazing that there is little overlap because the essays approach this topic from different points of view. For example, Horgan and Timmons provide a Moorean phenomenology to illuminate the significance of the OQA while Fumerton uses the argument to clarify the nature of philosophical analysis.

Themes from G. E. Moore: New Essays in Epistemology and Ethics is a welcome addition to the re-evaluation of Moore's philosophical legacy. The book as a whole is well-organized; the authors cover a wide range of topics related to Moore's work in epistemology and ethics. The well written essays are timely and the authors demonstrate the contemporary relevance of Moore's work by showing how his views illuminate current disputes. This book will be useful to experts in the field and is accessible to those who are new comers to Moore's work.