Theoretical Virtues in Science: Uncovering Reality through Theory

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Samuel Schindler, Theoretical Virtues in Science: Uncovering Reality through Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 249pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108422260.

Reviewed by Greg Frost-Arnold, Hobart and William Smith Colleges


Samuel Schindler's book is an impressive achievement: it presents four interlocking arguments for scientific realism -- one central, the other three supporting -- that taken together are novel, interesting, and worth serious study. So if you are interested in new ideas in the scientific realism debates, I recommend reading it. Additionally, it will be useful to those who want an overview of the current state of the realism debates, because Schindler's explanations of the state of the art are clear and accurate. As his title signals, his arguments for realism all involve the theoretical virtues, such as empirical accuracy, simplicity, and fertility. Thus anyone working on, or even just appealing to, the theoretical virtues could also profit from the book, for Chapter 1 provides a good summary of them. In particular, Schindler offers extended treatments of the virtues of fertility (Ch.4) and of being non-ad hoc (Ch. 5) (the discussion of which has unfortunately languished somewhat since (Leplin 1997)). There are also novel ideas about the history of science's evidential relationship to philosophy of science (Ch. 7): how should historical scientists' actual activities bear on theorizing about norms of scientific reasoning? So anyone interested in these topics -- realism, the theoretical virtues (particular ones, or in general), or the methodological significance of science's history for its philosophy -- should find Schindler's book a source of new and provocative ideas.

To explain its central contributions, we must first understand the ongoing debates Schindler addresses. Why do the theoretical virtues, or criteria for theory choice, play an important role in the realism debates? One of the traditional arguments against scientific realism, the underdetermination argument, begins with the premise that multiple competing theories can all account for our observations. These competing scientific theories agree on all observations, but disagree about the unobserved parts of the world. Therefore, the anti-realist concludes, because observation is ultimately our only source of evidence, we should suspend judgment about which of these theories is true, since each is equally well-supported by our evidence. In short, data underdetermine theory, so we should refrain from believing that any particular one of these competitors is true.

The realist counters by denying that these incompatible theories must be equally well-supported. Evidential support is more than a theory's predictions being consistent with actual observations. The realist maintains that, all other things being equal, a theory that is e.g. simpler is better confirmed than a more complicated one. A more unifying or consilient theory is better supported than an assemblage of narrow hypotheses tacked together that explain the same phenomena as the more unifying theory. If these additional virtues are used, then some of the multiple theories consistent with the data will be better supported than others, i.e. the observations will not support all the hypotheses equally well. Therefore, the realist concludes, when we use the full list of theoretical virtues, the data no longer underdetermine theory choice.

The anti-realist replies by appealing to a distinction between epistemic and pragmatic reasons for theory choice. The anti-realist can grant that scientists usually adopt simpler theories over more complex ones, but that could be because the simpler theory would be easier to work with -- a merely practical or pragmatic reason. In short, the anti-realist can hold that consistency and empirical accuracy are the only genuinely epistemic, i.e. truth-conducive, virtues; the others are merely pragmatic.

Schindler offers four arguments in favor of the realist's contention that all the usual theoretical virtues are epistemic. His list of virtues includes empirical accuracy, consistency (both internal and external), unifying power, simplicity, and fertility (57).[1] His "central" argument for realism is the 'No-Virtue-Coincidence Argument' (NVC), which concludes that "a theory that possesses all of the . . . standard virtues is likely to be true" (211). This argument crucially appeals to an equation Earman (2000) derives from Bayes' Theorem. Informally, this equation expresses the following idea. Imagine you have a group of witnesses, each of whose reports is independent of other witnesses' reports: that is, the probability that I report that a particular event happened (assuming it did)[2] is not raised or lowered by your reporting that this event happened. Furthermore, each witness is "relatively reliable," which means that they are more likely to assert p in circumstances where p is true than when p is false (i.e. witnesses' true positive rate is greater than their false positive rate; mathematically, a relatively reliable witness is one for whom Pr(Witness asserts p | p) > Pr(Witness asserts p | ~p)). Note that a witness can be relatively reliable without being absolutely reliable, i.e. without their assertions probably being true (mathematically, an absolutely reliable witness is one for whom Pr(p | Witness asserts p) > 0.5). The Earman equation shows that, no matter how small the prior probability of some claim is, as the number of such witnesses who assert it increases, the posterior probability of that claim's truth approaches 1. In short, as more and more independent and relatively reliable witnesses claim that some event happened, the claim that the event happened becomes better and better confirmed -- even if, prior to all of these witnesses' testimonies, that event is extremely unlikely.

The core idea of Schindler's NVC argument is to substitute 'scientist' for 'witness,' and 'scientific theory' for the arbitrary claim p in the Earman equation, and argue that the above conditions on the 'witnesses' are (at least approximately) met by a scientific community entertaining a scientific theory with all five theoretical virtues. On this substitution, as an increasing number of independent, relatively reliable scientists endorse a particular theory because of its virtues, the posterior probability of that theory tends towards 1. In other words, the rational degree of belief in theories with all five virtues will be high -- and endorsing a high degree of belief in a virtuous scientific theory is one way of expressing the thesis of scientific realism.

Schindler argues that a scientific community considering a hypothesis that displays all the theoretical virtues will approximate the characteristics of witnesses in Earman's equation. Schindler of course recognizes that the population of scientists does not actually approach infinity, so that condition is not literally met; however, this kind of idealization ('let n go to infinity') is common in science, and furthermore no current scientific realist wants to claim that our rational degree of belief in our current theories should approach arbitrarily close to 1 (since realists are fallibilists). But other conditions must be approximately met. For instance, to deliver the realist conclusion, Schindler makes the reasonable assertions that scientists accept theories on the basis of those theories' theoretical virtues, and that scientists are reasonably good judges of whether a theory has a particular virtue or not. That said, three more conditions must also be (approximately) met: the judgments of the members of the scientific community must be (i) unanimous, (ii) independent of each other, and (iii) relatively reliable. How does Schindler argue for this? Suppose we have a theory with his five typical theoretical virtues. One should accept the unanimity condition (i), Schindler claims, because if a theory has all of these virtues, then the vast majority of scientists are likely to accept it as correct, even if different scientists assign different weights to the same virtue. He appeals to Kuhn's later work on theory choice, which stresses that this possibility of different weightings among scientists is often actual. Schindler thinks this fact also supports the independence claim (ii), since scientists' assigning different weights to the five virtues will make their judgments independent of one another. His rationales for (iii) are more complicated and in-depth. He argues directly but briefly (in ยง2.5.4) that, for each virtue, a theory's having that virtue is a relatively reliable indicator of that theory's truth (e.g. Pr(p is simple | p) > Pr(p is simple | ~p)). And the other three main arguments in the book are also meant to bolster (iii), either for particular virtues (Ch. 1 and Ch. 5), or for all of them (the 'Argument from Choice,' discussed below).

One advantage Schindler claims for the NVC may not be obvious to those not currently working on the scientific realism debates. In recent years, one of the most-discussed objections to the No-Miracles Argument for realism (NMA) is that it commits the Base-Rate fallacy (Howson 2000; Magnus and Callender 2004). Here is the basic idea of the NMA argument: (P1) if a theory is not even approximately true, then the probability that it will enjoy great empirical successes is low, and (P2) if a theory is true, then the probability that it will enjoy great empirical success is high (if not 1). Then, from the fact that (P3) current theory T enjoys great empirical success, we infer that T is probably true. (Note: realists may reject this formulation of the NMA.) However, the base-rate objector points out, this conclusion does not follow. For T's probable truth to follow from (P1-P3), we must also have the base rate of true theories, which is the percentage of true theories in the total population of all theories. For if the base rate of true theories is low enough, then (P1-P3) can all be true, but T still be probably false. Now in the NVC version of Earman's equation, Schindler reasonably construes the prior probability of the theory T as the base rate of true theories. And thus Earman's equation shows that (if we have the right kind of agreement among scientists) the base rate actually does not matter at all: no matter how low the base rate/prior probability gets, the posterior probability of T still goes to 1 as the number of scientists endorsing the theory increases. So we get the realist's conclusion, without having to assume anything stronger than a non-zero base rate of true theories -- which is probably as powerful a reply to the base-rate objection as a realist could hope for.

I am happy to grant Schindler his argument for the unanimity condition (i). However, I have a reservation about the independence condition (ii). I strongly suspect that the average scientist is less likely to accept a theory when 1% of the relevant scientific community accepts that theory, than when 99% of the community does, all else being equal. That said, in Schindler's defense, there are many cases where scientists do judge the available evidence approximately independently of one other, and/or are willing to disagree with powerful individuals, or with the majority of scientists. For example, if two scientists with no substantive professional contact each read the same new article in Nature, and come to accept its proposed new hypothesis on the basis of the evidence presented therein, then their two judgments will be independent in the way the NVC requires.

The central question in evaluating Schindler's case for realism concerns condition (iii). Are empirical accuracy and consistency the only relatively reliable indicators of truth, or should simplicity, fertility, and unifying power also be on that list? Are these further virtues genuinely epistemic, or merely pragmatic? One of Schindler's main arguments that they are epistemic is his 'Argument from Choice' (Ch. 6), which runs as follows. If consistency and empirical adequacy are the only genuinely epistemic virtues (which Schindler calls the 'Negative View'), then "a theory may not be believed when it is not empirically adequate, regardless of how virtuous it is" (158) (this is the 'dictatorship condition' -- since it states empirical adequacy dominates simplicity, unifying power, etc.). Schindler then provides six historical cases in which, he claims, scientists rationally held that other virtues outweigh empirical adequacy; that is, Schindler claims these cases violate the dictatorship condition. Then, by modus tollens, we get Schindler's desired conclusion that empirical adequacy (and consistency) are not the only epistemic virtues.

I grant the conditional of Schindler's Argument from Choice for the sake of argument. However, I am not convinced that his historical cases are in fact counterexamples to the dictatorship condition. Let us examine one of them. Mendeleev's periodic law, when it was proposed, contradicted the experimentally-established values at the time for the atomic weights of uranium and beryllium: for example, the then-established value for the atomic weight of uranium was 120, whereas Mendeleev's periodic law assigned it a weight of 240. Mendeleev maintained his own theory in spite of the countervailing experimental evidence that the weight was 120, and claimed the established data was incorrect.

Schindler claims that this case shows that the dictatorship condition is incorrect: Mendeleev's theory, when first proposed, did not appear to be empirically adequate, yet he nonetheless believed it rationally. I think, however, that cases like Mendeleev's are not only compatible with the dictatorship condition, but actually may be evidence for it. For Mendeleev did not claim that the unifying power of his periodic law outweighed the few apparently incorrect predictions it made; rather, he claimed that his theory was empirically adequate, and it was the then-accepted data that were incorrect. That is, he recognized that the great unifying power of the periodic law could not license belief that the periodic law is true unless the periodic law was also empirically adequate. That appears to be an appeal to the dictatorship condition. And Schindler's other cases that purport to disprove the dictatorship condition are similar: for example, Rosalind Franklin had apparently good experimental data that DNA was not always helix-shaped. Crick's response to those data was "Well, they're wrong" (167). What cases like these disprove is not the dictatorship condition, but rather a different claim: 'A theory may not be believed when it is not consistent with currently available data, regardless of how virtuous that theory is otherwise.' But consistency with currently available data sets is not equivalent to empirical adequacy. Granted, one of the best indications we finite mortals can have that a claim is empirically adequate is that the claim is consistent with currently available data. But as the cases of Mendeleev and of Watson and Crick make clear, when scientists endorse a theory, they believe it is empirically adequate, even if that forces them to also believe that there are mistakes in the currently available data -- exactly as the dictatorship condition predicts.

Though I think Schindler's argument through the dictatorship condition does not work, these historical cases can be marshaled, in a Schindlerian spirit, to deliver the same conclusion that unifying power etc. are epistemic, as follows. Schindler's historical cases suggest that a theory's unifying power can rationally justify doubting the correctness of an observation report. And realists and anti-realists agree that observation reports function as (purported) evidence, i.e. as epistemic reasons, for or against theories. Finally, if we add the plausible claim that that the only thing that can rationally justify doubting a piece of (purported) evidence is another piece of evidence, i.e. an epistemic reason, then it logically follows that a theory's unifying power is an epistemic reason. These three premises are of course not incontrovertible, but the above argument seems very much in the spirit of Schindler's view, without denying the dictatorship condition.

This book is a clear, direct, and innovative defense of realism. I hope I have made the case that it is worth studying, especially if you are interested in the scientific realism debates, or in particular theoretical virtues.


Earman, John (2000). Hume's Abject Failure: The Argument against Miracles. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Howson, Colin (2000). Hume's Problem: Induction and the Justification of Belief. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Leplin, Jarrett (1997). A Novel Defense of Scientific Realism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Magnus, P. D. and Craig Callender (2004). "Realist Ennui and the Base Rate Fallacy," Philosophy of Science 71: 320-338.

[1] Although testability is on Schindler's initial list of theoretical virtues (6), it does not appear in his argument for realism. Presumably, testability is omitted because the more testable a theory is, i.e. the more possibilities it rules out, the less likely that theory is to be true, all else being equal. That is, testability is falsity-conducive, not (purportedly) truth-conducive, like the other five virtues on Schindler's list.

[2] Note that the reports are not statistically independent simpliciter, but rather independent conditional on the event's actually happening; hence the parenthetical 'assuming it did' above (56). For if you and I witness the same event and are both reliable witnesses, then even if we have no direct causal contact with each other, our reports of that event will nonetheless be correlated, i.e. statistically dependent. However, conditional on the event's actually happening, our reports are statistically independent (since we have no contact). So here 'independent' always abbreviates 'independent conditional on the truth of the claim being endorsed.'